Religion and Democratic Citizenship: Inquiry and Conviction in the American Public Square

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J. Caleb Clanton, Religion and Democratic Citizenship: Inquiry and Conviction in the American Public Square, Lexington Books, 2008, 161pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780739120811.

Reviewed by Lucas Swaine, Dartmouth College


Caleb Clanton uses this book to argue for an "open model" of religion in the public square, one that can "accommodate as many democratically predisposed citizens as possible" (10, cf. 150). Clanton is clearly distressed by liberal approaches to religion and politics. As he understands them, liberals contend that "[r]eligious authorities -- and religions in general -- have no business in the public realm" (5). Liberals think that religious convictions "should not be a determining force in the political sphere" (6, cf. 94). Clanton also criticizes notable pragmatists' positions on the nature and place of religion in democratic life, in hopes of clearing space for a new and better view of "how religion should factor into the American public square" (p. 9).

Clanton devotes two chapters to criticism of pragmatism, one of which is chiefly on William James. Clanton suggests that, for James, the "meliorism" of religion could provide practical benefits for the American citizenry (21, 22-23, cf. 30). But Clanton worries that James's position, which calls for "semantic reconstruction" of religious discourse, would not resonate with "old-time religionists" (16, cf. 43). James's view only accommodates some believers, thereby "crippling his notion of religious pluralism considerably" (24, cf. 32). To the traditional religious believer, whose views James would "exclude" (26), James's very idea of God sounds like advocacy of idolatry and narcissism (25, 26). What's more, says Clanton, James's droopy theory is "pragmatically impotent" and so looks problematic on Jamesian grounds (17, 32). Clanton wonders whether James was a religious pluralist at all, given that James's interpretation of religious beliefs leads one to conclude that "all religious beliefs effectively mean the same thing" (28). And other pragmatists' efforts to reconstruct religion are similarly weak: neither Emerson, nor Santayana, nor Dewey created a theory that was pragmatically capable or "robustly sensitive to pluralism" (33, 34). Clanton concludes that pragmatism is in fact "anti-religious," at least as far as religious believers are concerned (35, cf. 73).

The other chapter on pragmatism endeavors to deal with the more contemporary views of Richard Rorty and Cornel West. Like James, states Clanton, Rorty "excludes" the citizens he purports to include in the public square (40). Rorty wants to strip religious views of their "metaphysical substance," rendering religious beliefs mere symbolic remnants of "humanistic hope" (41, 42). The problem, Clanton figures, is that traditional believers' words "can no longer carry [their] meaning" in Rorty's public square (43, 44). Even more strongly, Clanton declares that traditional religionists "cannot be allowed to speak in their own voices," according to Rorty's theory (44). With regard to West, Clanton lets fly with the accusation that West creates "manipulative" relationships with African-American churches (49, 54 ff.). West's "prophetic pragmatism" engages in "deceptive behavior" to the extent that it would use traditionalists' religious claims for political purposes (55-56). This is, says Clanton, "cause for suspicion of ethical foul play" (56, cf. 57).

Chapter four begins with a stated need to include treatment of the "conversation and debates" about John Rawls's scholarship. The chapter focuses largely on Rawls, but Clanton hopes to net a collection of liberal views on religion in the public domain (64, cf. 76, 80). He admits it is not his priority to read Rawls systematically, conceding also that he will not try to "engage very deeply in Rawlsian scholarship" (64). Despite these qualifications, however, he proposes that Rawls believed religion ought to be "bracketed" and "kept separate" from the public square (71). Rawls's proviso gets brief mention: with it, Rawls "allows for a sort of IOU submission of religious reasons" (72). But even Rawls's wide view of public reason "cannot accommodate" citizens who take their justificatory reasons to be religious in nature (73, 95). And this problem applies as well to the many liberals who are "Rawlsian in type" (80), according to Clanton. Rawlsian "separatism," Clanton announces, amounts to a "politics of hypocrisy" (85, 124, 131).

Clanton then turns his attention to what he calls the liberal doctrine of neutrality: that citizens and officials "should remain neutral among comprehensive doctrines," and religions, when deliberating on public policy (85, cf. 92). Michael Sandel apparently demonstrated that neutrality in public policy is a pipe dream (87-89), and Clanton muses that, if liberal neutrality were impossible, cause for denying religion entrance to the public square would thereby be lost (91). Clanton also suggests that much of a citizenry's discussions would be left "impotent and inconclusive" if citizens followed so-called neutralist "restraints" on deliberation (98). Furthermore, Clanton charges, deliberation cannot revise itself under the liberal's "neutralist restraints" (100). Lest one think that claim to be over the top, Clanton adds that restrictions and constraints on religion "in all cases" amount to "oppression" (125, cf. 128). "In all cases," he continues, liberals tell religious citizens that their religious convictions have "no proper place in the public square" (125, cf. 130). By the end of his short treatment, Clanton asserts that he "showed" that the doctrine of neutrality is "thoroughly problematic" (107).

Clanton then moves to consider Jeffrey Stout's contributions to the matter of religion and the public square. He sides with Stout when it comes to people "say[ing] what [they] please" regarding their religious views (108). But allowing people to say what they wish is dangerous, to the minds of Rawlsians: that radical thought leaves those poor saps wondering how such a society could avoid "all out [sic] religious war" (108). Clanton likewise appreciates Stout's doctrine of "immanent criticism," a theory whereby one attempts to criticize an interlocutor's views respectfully, from within the other's position (109). But he says that it is "not clear" that Stout's attempt to move beyond Rawls "is altogether successful" (111). This is because Stout would place "a certain sort of conversational restraint" on religious citizens (113), insofar as he advocates abandoning resentment of pluralism. And if religious discourse were limited "to terms of convincing," states Clanton, then religious citizens would already be constrained "in all the ways" required by Rawls (116, cf. 119-20). To advance the discussion, Clanton proposes to "pick up where Stout leaves off": he forges ahead by examining the aims of religious speech acts that "forego [sic] or suspend temporarily" the goal of convincing people engaged in deliberation (121).

In the final chapter, Clanton provides the blueprint for a new model of deliberative democracy drawn from Socrates and C. S. Pierce (123). The centerpiece of his display is the following:

[R]eligious citizens are free to employ whatever reasons they see fit to advance in the course of public deliberation. Likewise, the secularist is free to do the same. (126)

To elaborate, Clanton suggests that religious citizens should be "invited" to participate "with whatever reasons they see fit to bring" (128). Religious participants in the public square should be afforded space "to voice their religious convictions and reasons" (134). They should not be "told that they cannot discuss" their deepest convictions (130). And this applies to a wide variety of speech acts: even unpersuasive religious reasoning can "interrupt" and "challenge" the deliberative forum, leading citizens to reconsider their values and assumptions (131). In sum, Clanton says that citizens generally should be "allowed to engage" each other (128, emphasis in original). This idea he extracts from Socrates, someone who showed an important kind of respect for people by taking them as they were, in discussion, instead of imposing the "gag rules" demanded by Rawls (129).

But in case readers might think his theory normatively anemic, Clanton injects a special criterion -- the "fallible inquiry requirement" (138-42, 143-45). Like Socrates, he proposes, citizens should be open to the "possibility" of being refuted or defeated in deliberation (128-29, 136-37, 139). To participate in "inquiry with other citizens," Clanton suggests, one should be willing to hold one's beliefs and views "in a fallible manner" (139, cf. 136-38). This, Clanton avers, is necessary to be a good deliberative citizen, and it suffices to show that "there is no need to restrict [religious citizens'] use of religious reasoning in the democratic public square" (147, cf. 139, 141). He concludes that his argument is not intended to be "an apology for careless citizenship" (150), perhaps anticipating the deluge of criticism his claims might provoke.

To the extent that Clanton argues for a place for religious reasons in the public square, he makes a worthwhile point. This is because some religious reasons should count as admissible in democratic deliberation. For example, liberal government must draw upon natural theology reasons in order to justify the application of liberal laws and policies to theocrats. In addition, Clanton does well insofar as he admonishes people not to immediately discount, much less to attempt to silence, religious voices in democratic discussion.

There are, however, serious problems with Clanton's argument. For one, Clanton's criterion of fallibility is lax and unsatisfactory, and it underspecifies the open public square he wishes to defend. First of all, Clanton does not stipulate that citizens must be open to the possibility of being defeated in deliberation by any other citizen. This allows citizens who are open to deliberative defeat from anyone other than Catholics or African-Americans to count as people who have not violated "the duties of good citizenship" (139, 141, 142, 145). Second, Clanton does not adequately discuss the extent to which a citizen must be "willing" to be defeated in deliberation. Should citizens actively seek out people with whom to engage in dialogue, like Socrates did? The parameters of engagement that Clanton describes are vague and not especially helpful. Third, Clanton's citizens are not required by his criterion to engage sympathetically with rival views, in cases where people do discuss pressing issues with others in the public square. In fact, a fallibilistic outlook does not even require that one try to understand what other people are saying, despite Clanton's apparent interest in promoting deliberative inquiry (142). Fourth, Clanton's view is too generous to hate-mongers and bigots who could, while allowing for the possibility of "deliberative defeat" (139), argue that a democratic polity should segregate or debase a vulnerable minority. Whether such speakers use religious reasons or not, Clanton's view permits those people to qualify as good citizens, without adequate discussion of why that should be so.

But there is even more reason to think that Clanton's "open model" of the public square would be excessively slack with regard to reasons that citizens give one to another (10, 150). For Clanton's view does not require that citizens offer reasons that they sincerely believe to be any good, in deliberations with their compatriots (cf. 140-41). Indeed, Clanton's citizens may permissibly give reasons for or against policies and laws that they know that others should not accept, in their efforts to get a policy passed. Because the minimalist "fallible inquiry requirement" can be met by insincere or manipulative citizens, there is even further reason to think that Clanton's attempt to pare down the normative requirements of the public square simply does not succeed.

In addition, the distinction between admissible reasons, on one hand, and simple free speech concerns, on the other, creates a real predicament for Clanton's case. For he repeatedly confuses the legal right to free speech, and matters pertaining to that right, with admissible and inadmissible reasons in public deliberation. Clanton's understanding of the democratic domain engenders this confusion: he maintains that his "pubic square [sic]" is broad, "spanning everything from citizen protests at the local grocery store to neighborhood sporting events to town hall meetings … to national debates on affirmative action" (8). It is a space where people participate in activities "as citizens affecting other citizens" (8, emphasis in original). There is no restriction to reason-giving in his conception; simple expression, advocacy of political candidates, and speech acts not intended to convince, are included in Canton's realm (8, 116, 119-21).

At times, Clanton bemoans liberal arguments to the effect that citizens should curtail their use of religious reasons in public debate: he objects to religious reasons being "bracketed" (71), and similarly to "restraints" on democratic deliberation (98, cf. 100), wishing instead to have accommodation of religious citizens' reasons (73, 95). But he then suggests that religious citizens are "told [by liberals] that they cannot discuss" their central concerns (130), which is a view that almost nobody holds. And again, lest one think this a mere slip on Clanton's part, consider other comments of his in this respect. He attributes to his adversaries the claim that religion must be kept "separate from matters of the public square" (71, cf. 128), whereas that would imply no public space even for people to air their views, contrary to any serious liberal position. He asserts that "in all cases" liberals see "no place" for religious expression in the public domain (125), while ignoring the fact that it is liberals who defend the right of people to express their views publicly. Clanton's grandiose claims would be true only if liberals -- or pragmatists, for that matter -- argued that religious people literally should not be permitted to say what they think. But Clanton's adversaries do not and certainly need not propose as much; and so his case against them, like his argument for an open public square, remains unmade.