Religion and the Demise of Liberal Rationalism: The Foundational Crisis of the Separation of Church and State

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Owen, J. Judd, Religion and the Demise of Liberal Rationalism: The Foundational Crisis of the Separation of Church and State, The University of Chicago Press, 2001, 218 pp, $16.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-226-64192-9.

Reviewed by David McCabe, Colgate University


The overall question motivating J. Judd Owen’s argument here is whether liberal regimes can successfully defend their commitment to church-state separation and, more broadly, to the ideal of neutrality towards religious worldviews that distinguishes them. His answer is that they can, but only if they abandon the antifoundationalist approach that in his view powerfully informs contemporary liberalism and turn instead to an alternative account rooted in seventeenth and eighteenth century thought. Owen’s brief, then, is both critical and constructive: the (predominant) critical part aims to demonstrate the inadequacies of any antifoundationalist defense of liberal separation, the constructive part to outline a stronger account that will as well be fairer to persons deeply committed to religious worldviews.

By antifoundationalism Owen has in mind the denial that any “claim to knowledge is founded in the one truth” and the corresponding insistence that all claims to knowledge, being inescapably rooted in perspectival and contingent worldviews, lack genuine transcultural objectivity (p. 2). For Owen the most noteworthy culprits here are Richard Rorty and John Rawls (in his more recent, political-liberalism phase). Because they deny that liberalism should be defended either via any transcendent faculty of rationality that discerns enduring truths about the way the world is (Rorty) or through rational argument establishing the superiority of any single comprehensive moral theory (Rawls), both in the end can defend liberal regimes as nothing more than a particular set of practices with historic precedent in particular contexts but which have no intrinsic superiority over other forms of political organization. And, since neither Rorty nor Rawls refutes the existence of the foundationalist source for moral knowledge claimed by some religions (Rorty remains metaphysically agnostic, while Rawls brackets such questions from political philosophy), neither rebuts the foundationalist’s claim to be in touch with that source and to know what it recommends for political decisions. Thus antifoundationalist liberals and religious foundationalists can confront one another only as adherents of rival faiths, and as the clever title of Owen’s first chapter asks, “If liberalism is a faith, what becomes of church-state separation?”

Owen’s readings of Rorty and Rawls are resourceful and subtle, and he raises a variety of serious questions for both. But in both cases it can be objected that he has eased the challenge for the foundationalist foe of liberal separation by presenting Rorty’s and Rawls’ views in something less than their most compelling form. On the subject of Rorty, Owen’s critique is in many ways exemplary. He resists the siren call of Rorty’s seductive rhetoric and is especially good in pointing to serious obscurities in the argument for liberalism advanced in Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity. His criticism that Rorty too often greets challenges to liberal ideology with “smug complacency” is perfectly put, especially in light of Rorty’s allowance that nothing in the nature of things guarantees the lasting triumph of liberalism on the human stage, and he is right on the money in challenging Rorty’s equivocation over the degree to which the ironist attitude induced by antifoundationalism is conducive or hostile to liberalism, in the process pointing to a deep ambiguity in Rorty’s presentation of the ironist culture he alternately celebrates and cautions against.

But despite such probing criticisms, there is, I think, more to be said for Rorty’s antifoundationalist liberalism than Owen credits. To say this is not necessarily to fault Owen: what easily gets lost in Rorty’s over-the-top deflationary posturing is the implicit connection between an approach to the question of what makes beliefs more or less warranted that takes the task of justification seriously indeed, and a defense of liberalism that grows naturally out of that approach. In defending his coherentism (to put a positive name to his antifoundationalism), Rorty insists that the absence of foundations does not mean that all our beliefs are radically up for grabs, nor does it deny us criteria for properly judging some as more or less justified. Against such an interpretation he has pointed out that forming and assessing beliefs (even though it involves human decisions) is not a voluntary process in which subjects go wherever they list, but is in large part one that is responsive to a natural and a social world both of which provide constraints on what can reasonably be believed.

For Rorty, then, the rejection of foundationalism does not leave us only with “mere belief and unexamined practice,” to cite a phrase from Stanley Fish that Owen quotes more than once. To see the situation in terms of this dichotomy, Rorty believes, is already to accept the foundationalist approach. Owen is aware of this response in Rorty, but I don’t think he explores it as fully as he might. Aside from Rorty’s occasional urge to invoke the fatuous claim “that’s just how we do things here,” he has offered several reasons to prefer liberalism over its competitors: the liberal ethnos champions the fullest and freest exchange of ideas and so ensures that our beliefs are maximally justified given our own hard-to-escape frameworks of meaning; liberal regimes best encourage the articulation of ideas that might resolve entrenched problems; and no society that has tried liberalism has found it inferior to prior modes of social organization. I realize that each of these arguments is open to powerful objection, but collectively they point to a stronger defense of Rortyan liberalism than Owen presents here.

Owen’s probing and careful critique of Rawls invites a similar worry. Owen does a wonderful job both in elucidating the presuppositions Rawls is working with and in drawing attention, despite the accommodating tone that characterizes so much of the recent Rawls, to the degree to which those presuppositions may be rejected by citizens endorsing nonliberal religious worldviews. The very great weight Rawls accords to social stability and overlapping consensus are controversial moves, and to pose them as the basic desiderata of political philosophy is already to assert a contentious point. Additionally, by positioning the Rawls chapter after his critique of Rorty, Owen helpfully illustrates the precise way in which Rawls’ antifoundationalism differs from Rorty’s: while Rorty defends liberalism from an avowedly anti-foundationalist stance, potentially alienating religious adherents who endorse some form of foundationalism, Rawls recognizes that such a move is too controversial and makes too strong a claim about foundationalism, viz. that no foundationalist approach gets things right. Rawls’ tolerance for foundationalism thus makes his account, initially at least, more promising as a way of defending liberal separation.

Where Rawls goes wrong, though, according to Owen, is in insisting that only those citizens who accept certain basic requirements of a public conception of justice – i.e. notions like reciprocity, equal respect, and fairness – qualify as reasonable and so can legitimately insist that the principles of political order be justified to them. Owen argues that this conception of the reasonable begs the critical question, for it excludes from the outset those groups whose religious worldviews deny Rawls’ assumptions of what makes a view reasonable. From within their own religions, such groups have no good reason to accept the doctrine of liberal separation, or liberal neutrality generally.

It’s not clear to me, though, how much liberals should be bothered by this limitation. No principles of justice will satisfy everyone. Along with the theocrat committed to a nonliberal religious view, the Neo-Nazi and the Klan member will also be excluded from Rawls’ overlapping consensus. Is this really problematic? It can be argued that everyone brings to their thinking about justice a conception of certain requirements that have to be met for a solution to count as just, and for many these presuppositions are likely to include equality, fairness, respect, and the like in a manner violated by Neo-Nazis, the KKK, and nonliberal religions (by definition). Owen’s point appears to be that Rawls’ idea of the reasonable, because not grounded in the sort of foundationalist account Rawls abjures, ultimately figures as nothing more than an ungrounded belief that carries little moral authority when confronted with the viewpoints of theocrats (and the KKK, one wonders?). To this, however, Rawls has replied (most clearly in his lectures on Kantian constructivism) that our options are not exhausted by direct contact with a realm of preexisting moral absolutes on the one hand and radical choice (mere belief) on the other: instead, moral deliberators always already find themselves with conceptions of the person, and some minimal sense of what morality requires, that figure as necessary constraints on any acceptable solution to the problem of social cooperation. (For Rawls the principles of freedom, equality, reciprocity and the like constitute such fixed horizons for many.) Owen would deny that this move preserves the sort of objectivity we want in moral theory, but this just raises the further question – made especially acute by Rorty’s quasi-transcendental argument against the very possibility of our experiencing the world in itself in a manner communicable to others – of whether any position could deliver the objectivity Owen seeks. No doubt foundationalists claim it, but do their mere claims, absent compelling argument, mandate uptake in the public realm?

The discussion of Rorty and Rawls is followed by two chapters (plus an Appendix) taking up the critique of liberalism advanced by Stanley Fish, whom Owen regards as having made utterly clear the ruins that await any antifoundationalist liberalism. To my mind the discussion of Fish is much less rewarding than the rest of the book, in part because Fish’s critique of the ideal of liberal neutrality has always struck me as something of a non-starter. As Owen presents it, Fish’s critique argues that liberalism’s appeal to neutrality is a sham, because any argument for neutrality must invoke as premises moral claims that are themselves non-neutral. But this is an objection only to those who thought liberal neutrality involved wholesale neutrality on normative questions. A moment’s reflection, however, should have made clear that no defense of any substantive position in political philosophy could ever get off the ground without taking a stand on some normative positions. Liberalism as value neutral was always a crazy idea. But the idea that a neutral state is logically implied by the values variously said to lie at the heart of liberalism (e.g. the ideal of autonomy, the importance of equal respect, the virtue of reciprocity) is a very different notion, and one that Fish’s critique does not illuminate. For these reasons I suspect the discussion of Fish, despite Owen’s impressive familiarity with the intricacies of his position, will be less interesting to readers of the book than the material on Rorty and Rawls.

Having spent the bulk of his book arguing that antifoundationalist strategies cannot adequately ground church-state separation, Owen in the final pages offers his own all-too-brief constructive account of a foundationalist rationality that does a better job. His constructive account is admittedly sketchy and preliminary, but even so, it’s hard to see how the approach he recommends is any more likely to satisfy the discontented theocrat than, say, the Rawlsianism he rejects. Appealing to what he sees as the tradition of liberal rationalism embodied in the figures of “Hobbes, Locke, Montesquieu, Tocqueville, the American founders, and others,” Owen raises the possibility that “the liberal rationalists were right about human nature, religion, and political society” (163). This is a strange claim, not just because of the controversial inclusion of Hobbes as a liberal. More puzzlingly, is it really true that these figures held a common view about human nature and religion? If so, what was it? For starters, the views of human nature and religion held by Hobbes and Locke (the only two whom Owen discusses in any detail) seem to differ significantly. It is true that notwithstanding these differences both were led to champion civil peace and tranquility above all other political ends, but if this is what really unites them, how different are their views from the Rawlsian political liberalism that Owen finds wanting? Why should foundationalist theocrats be more willing to accept the liberal terms of social peace when defended by the Hobbesian/Lockean/Spinozistic line (assuming there is such a line) rather than the Rawlsian one?

The concerns I have raised about Owen’s argument touch on enormously disputed areas in contemporary political and moral theory, and no doubt Owen would offer a powerful reply. What comes across most clearly in this book are Owen’s strengths as a careful reader, his command of the relevant literature, and his commitment to following to their logical ends a huge number of the arguments he confronts along the way. The last of these has effects that I found not entirely salutary, though, for in various places Owen’s argument gets so deeply into the mire of fine and subtle controversies that readers may lose a clear sense of how the issue in question relates to the abiding topic of the book. This may in part explain why a book so tightly argued and resourcefully defended lacks the cumulative impact one would expect. That criticism aside, the book is valuable both for its thoughtful exploration of an urgent topic – the general relationship between antifoundationalism and liberalism – and for its careful accounts of the recent work of Rorty and Rawls. Both of these figures offer ways of achieving consensus on liberal principles that many may sometimes suspect are too good to be true, and one great virtue of this book is to give powerful expression to just that suspicion.