Religion and the Liberal Polity

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Terence Cuneo, ed., Religion and the Liberal Polity, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 280pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0268022895.

Reviewed by John J. Davenport, Fordham University


Religion and the Liberal Polity is a collection of innovative essays from a highly distinguished group of authors resulting from a PEW Trust seminar with Nicholas Wolterstorff. The book is similar in quality to an earlier collection edited by Paul Weithman in 1997. Most of the essays are successful in finding new angles on their chosen topics, including the question of whether it is right for citizens and officials in democratic societies to use religious beliefs as bases for political choices or cite religious reasons in political advocacy. This question has become familiar in political philosophy and democratic theory since the 1990s, when an imposing list of religious thinkers -- from Weithman and Wolterstorff to Philip Quinn, Chris Eberle, Kent Greenawalt and several others -- challenged secular-reason requirements defended by John Rawls and Robert Audi. These critics were motivated both by (1) the conviction that secularist political theory is cutting itself off from powerful strands of liberal religious conscience that helped abolish slavery and win civil rights, and (2) that contemporary liberal theory is undermining democracy by restricting it to inadequate epistemic sources of justification.

With the partial exception of Greenawalt, who argues that public school teachers should not impose their religious views on students, the authors in Cuneo's collection all agree with this new 'unlimited religious inclusivist' position (or URI as I will call it). In this, they often owe a debt to Reformed Epistemology, with its denial of traditional faith/reason distinctions (although only Richard Mouw's essay explores this connection). Unfortunately, such an epistemology entails that there can be no principled distinction between theocracy (including popular theocracy) as the rule of revealed religious truths, and democracy as the rule of natural reason (possibly including natural theology) in public deliberation. The authors defending URI in past work, and in Cuneo's collection, do not focus on this implication or admit its dangers, because they do not focus on the distinction between special revelation and other 'natural' sources of epistemic justification (i.e. the faith/reason distinction). Instead, they define their view by opposition to what Cuneo calls the "public justification thesis." As derived from Audi,

This thesis tells us that respecting our fellow citizens requires that, when we support coercive laws … we offer them reasons that they can accept. In particular, the reasons we offer must be "intelligible" or "accessible" to other "reasonable" agents or persons … (p.7).

Jeffrey Stout also refers to Stephen Macedo's over-demanding requirement of grounds that "all reasonable people should be able to accept" (p.160). But there is a vital difference between (a) reasons, beliefs, considerations etc. that are "intelligible" to others in the sense that others can understand their significance or epistemic force as reasons transcending brute preference, and (b) reasons that others can or should accept, given their own epistemic framework, as a fair basis for regulating social cooperation. The former can include reasons drawn from rival comprehensive conceptions articulable in terms of natural knowledge (even if we disagree with them), but arguably it cannot include truths allegedly revealed by God that we have not experienced as revelation, or in which we have no faith. Thus refuting Rawls's position that we have sufficient overlapping consensus to ground a liberal democratic conception of justice for basic institutions -- or more accurately that, given our natural motivation to live together on the basis of public reasons shared with other citizens who are "reasonable" and thus similarly motivated, we can jointly find or construct such an overlapping consensus -- is still not sufficient to justify URI.

For example, Stout follows Wolterstorff in arguing that respectful debate aimed at justifying laws enforced by the coercive power of the state -- or even constitutional essentials -- does not have to proceed from a "common basis;" rather, it can "proceed piecemeal," by way of immanent criticism of each type of perspective in terms of its own worldview (p.167). This has the odd implication that citizens in a legitimate democracy bear the burden of mastering each others's religious traditions and texts. To argue against a Christian who supports slavery, I should refer to Galatians 3 (p.166). Suppose someone of the Sikh faith is starting a movement to amend the Constitution to outlaw premarital sex; to argue that this is unjust, I would have to become an expert in the interpretation of Sikh texts and teachings. Likewise, I suppose that even to rebut a Satanist who wanted to legalize human sacrifice, I would have to learn what his cult claims to be revealed truths, in order to try to find alleged revelations in his traditions that weigh against human sacrifice. This last example may seem extreme, but it is important to emphasize that defenders of URI starting from Reformed Epistemology have not provided any clear way of deriving basic rights and liberties of individuals that would limit legislative and administrative powers over individuals. Moreover, since the Constitution itself can and should be amended periodically (a national convention for this purpose every 50 years would vastly improve our polity), the specification of basic rights must also be subject to a deliberative process in which intolerant religions may validly control the outcome if they have sufficient numbers of adherents, according to URI.

Even if I'm willing to accept the (often unreasonable) burden of engaging in religious hermeneutics in an effort to justify essential components of a liberal democratic constitution, dialogue will come quickly to an end. Suppose that my interlocutor is voting to amend the constitution to outlaw all abortion from the moment of conception, and I argue against this. But, she says, the Pope has infallibly revealed that we are persons from the moment of conception. I respond that I do not recognize this as infallible revelation; rather, I have faith in a prophet in my church who says that God told him in a dream that we are not persons until the moment of 'quickening.' Well, she says, your prophet is false and mine is true! If we each insist that these considerations alone are sufficient to decide the issue, then our discussion is halted: it has met an impenetrable wall. Yet apparently we have each done our best to supply reasons that we think the other "could reasonably accept" (p.159) and so we simply have to let the majority rule! What this example indicates is that pure revelational claims are often not susceptible to Stout's recommended Socratic approach (and, notably, none of Plato's dialogues involve Socrates debating with self-proclaimed Illuminati).

Of course, Stout may still be right that epistemically responsible people can reject the burden of trying to justify the basic structure for social cooperation on revelation-excluding grounds (p.164). But if so, that would only show that epistemically responsible people can reject democracy for theocracy, and I am not trying to rebut this here. Stout is misled in his defense of URI by the "intuition" that rights to free expression and free worship imply that citizens in democracy are free to make up their minds, and advocate publicly, on weighty political matters on the basis of faith (p.158). He assumes that this violates nobody else's rights (p.157). But aside from the pressing question of where these "rights" come from, deciding and advocating for law with allegedly revealed truths beyond the scope of natural reason as one's primary or sole basis violates every citizen's right to popular sovereignty, understood as the collective rule of natural reason over self-interest. In the deliberative account of the legitimacy of popular sovereignty, this basic right has the same ground (in the dignity of individual autonomy) as the other civil liberties, including the freedoms of worship, speech, equal status before the law, and liberty from bondage. This was also Lincoln's central thesis in his debates with Douglas. Stout is committing the liberal fallacy of assuming that these civil rights have some higher justification that is independent of the legitimation of majority rule (see the work of JŸrgen Habermas, which is routinely ignored in this debate).

Chris Eberle does not recognize this as a fallacy: he says that one can believe that civil rights, including freedom of conscience, are central to just government (and prior to economic goods), while denying that they must have a "public justification" (p.173). Such a position amounts, in my view, to assuming some basis for substantive liberal rights while leaving majority rule as a mere struggle of brute preferences over all statutory and policy options compatible with the basic rights -- and this is mere tyranny of the majority. But Eberle's focus here is on Gerald Gaus's detailed epistemic conception of justification appropriate for democratic politics. By relativizing public justification to an idealized version of each person's epistemic framework, I fear that Gaus has already moved too far in Stout's direction: Gaus goes for semi-idealized acceptability to each, given her beliefs about what counts as evidence, rather than natural universal accessibility. This opens him to Eberle's incisive critique that an agent's beliefs about what counts as warrant for normative judgments can also be corrupted by "prejudice or limited information" (p.181). There is no way to divide up beliefs "from which we may idealize, and those from which we may not" (p.182). But Eberle ignores the point that if conditions are so "epistemically hostile" that citizens cannot form any uncorrupted evaluative judgments, then democracy in the normative sense is impossible.

I also disagree with Eberle's claim that "any given theory of public justification" must lie somewhere along the continuum from populist to idealizing theories of universally acceptable reasons (p.189), and that consensus about religion should vary with consensus about the good along this continuum. First, unless we reduce revealed to rational religion, there is no reason to think that ideal employers of natural reason would agree on matters of pure faith (p.191). We see this in the fact that many Jewish, Islamic, and Christian theologians of the middle ages adhered to similar philosophical accounts of God, while professing quite distinct and incompatible revealed truths. Second, the deliberative ideal of democracy is not necessarily contractarian; it does not require actual or hypothetical unanimity about anything but the inviolable value of persons, respect for which requires both civil rights and self-governance by collective reasoning. But this ultimate norm involves commitment to the idea that citizens can distinguish between revelation and natural reason as sources of "evidence" for normative judgments. Revelation is special: since it requires total trust, it is essentially private, and impenetrable by external critique.

This is why, in politics, religious convictions function as an incorrigible basis for voting and advocacy, not as corrigible claims put forward to be tested by collective scrutiny and critique to see how well-justified they are. The citizen who brings her revelation-based beliefs into politics is hardly making her faith in these allegedly revealed truths conditional on surviving modification by critique in which the force of better reason(s) alone is controlling. But that is precisely what public justification requires for all the reasons that are inputs to the deliberative process. It starts with the actual beliefs and convictions of persons in what Mouw calls their thick particularity (p.204), but excludes revelation-based beliefs, and modifies the remainder in the ideal direction by dialogical elenchus, arguments conducted in public fora provided by the media, deliberation in legislative bodies, etc. Thus this model is neither populist nor ideal. The better our systems of education, media, and public debate are at modifying citizens's reasons in the ideal direction, the farther majority rule is from a mere modus vivendi for aggregating conflicting interests, and the more legitimate it is. This model is also compatible with Cuneo's idea that "participation in certain religious traditions plays a contributory role" in forming thick character traits that enable participation in many basic goods (p.124), and that the state should even encourage and support a strong role for religious voluntary associations in civil society. It only asks these religious associations to refrain from becoming lobbying groups arguing from allegedly revealed truths.

Thus, while several arguments presented in Cuneo's collection add to the considerable existing critiques of the "public justification thesis" so understood, they do not individually or collectively succeed in showing that democratic justice cannot be grounded solely on the resources of natural reason, or that the use of revealed truths in public debate, advocacy, or political choice is compatible with democratic ideals. Otherwise put, this book does not refute the widely held view that democratic government is legitimate (rather than mere tyranny of the majority preference, or of majority faith) only if its constitutional structure and the preponderance of its statues and policies are justified in public deliberation on the basis of reasons addressable and intelligible to all citizens, and open to rational critique, without excluding anyone on the basis of revealed religion.

That said, all of the essays in this volume remain valuable for novel analyses and insights; the book is full of first-class work in moral theory and moral psychology, much of which does not depend on what one thinks of URI. For example, Wolterstorff's essay is a groundbreaking argument that the rights of persons (both human and divine) are ultimate in moral explanation; duties/obligations derive from ontological excellences requiring respect (pp.39-40), and thus are not based on more ultimate rules or authorities. In defending this thesis, Wolterstorff presents a powerful critique of divine command theories of morality of the sort proposed by Quinn or Robert Adams: God's standing authority to issue morally binding commands and our correlative standing obligation to obey God are a moral authority and moral duty that cannot themselves be derived from divine command. In this, and in his view that God is a moral agent with a duty to fulfill his promises, Wolterstorff agrees with Kant.

While convincing, this critique of divine command theory seems unlikely to support URI; rather, it fits better with the view that we have some natural epistemic access to standing moral rights, independently of revealed demands and promises. Similarly, in his contribution, John Hare defends a Kantian "publicity standard" for theories of moral norms, and he recognizes that "it is probably constitutive of being a good citizen in a liberal democracy" to be willing to articulate honestly the sources or grounds from which one derives one's conception of justice (p.89). This conclusion fits well with the deliberative model, but it rules out Michael Ruse's projectivist evolutionary account of morality. With his usual rigor, Hare also reveals the fatal flaws in another leading evolutionary theory of morality developed by Larry Arnhart, which cannot justify equal moral regard for each human person (p.82). Hare's work thus provides more evidence that naturalistic grounds may not give us any conception of justice adequate for liberal democratic ideals; but this result remains consistent with the idea of a formal ethics independent of revelation.

The result is the same in several other essays. Merold Westphal makes a largely convincing argument for the social value of shame -- or rather the disposition to feel appropriate shame when one has acted unethically -- as a corrective or reformatory virtue. The only problem I see in Westphal's argument against the usual shame/guilt distinction is that guilt is an essentially autonomous state (with a volitional component) while shame, or even the trained disposition to it, is not always autonomous. But his convincing critique of Aristotle, Spinoza, and Nietzsche for rejecting shame is phenomenological, appealing to our natural epistemic powers. His Levinasian defense of shame as a fundamental experience of an involuntary moral responsibility for others does not in fact depend on faith in any historical revelation -- although Levinas misuses the terms "revelation" and "eschatology" for this ethical groundwork. Thus, as far as I can see, nothing in Levinas's epistemology is incompatible with the ideal of a deliberative democracy in which the public justification of basic institutions is independent of revealed truths received only in faith.

Timothy Jackson, another first-rate Kierkegaard scholar and philosopher of religion, argues that the inviolable value of personhood is located in the dependence of our flourishing on receiving and giving agapic love, which Jackson calls "sanctity," rather than in "achieved merit based on personal performance," which he calls "dignity" (pp.45-46). This position is potent because it is capable of answering Peter Singer's famous arguments that there is no metaphysical basis for distinguishing between the moral standing of infants, incompetent elderly, and mentally retarded human beings and sentient animals. Jackson seems to be right that human beings who are not moral agents still require agapic love to attain the best life possible for them, whereas other animals do not naturally require that kind of love to flourish (p.61). He is also persuasive in arguing that agapic care that responds to sanctity is a practical precondition for the possibility of any achieved dignity (p.48).

Yet problems arise from Jackson's terminology: (1) arguably the intrinsic value of persons as givers and receivers of agapic love can be recognized independently of revealed religion (whereas the term "sanctity" connotes revealed hierophany); (2) "dignity" as Jackson defines it is certainly not what Kant meant by the intrinsic dignity that a person has by virtue of being a free rational agent capable of autonomously recognizing moral responsibility. Jackson is probably right that the freedom and rationality necessary for moral agency are not an adequate basis for the inviolable value of human life, but that does not make Kantian dignity an acquired merit: Kantians who found human rights on rational selfhood (or the potential for it) are trying to justify an equal constitutive value in all persons; their theory certainly does not encourage arrogance or social hierarchy (as Jackson implies). Jackson's disagreement with Kant concerns the source or metaphysical ground of constitutive inviolability, not the relative importance of contingent merit versus inviolability. Kant would agree with Jackson that "respecting only achieved dignity cannot be willed as universal law" (p.50).

Moreover, Jackson's own approach seems to separate justice and charity too sharply (and here Alasdair MacIntyre's otherwise-similar approach in Dependent Rational Animals can be a corrective). As a result, Jackson limits duties of justice to merit-based claims, implying that inviolable sanctity leads to no duties of justice (p.62). Finally, although Jackson opposes "elective abortion, active euthanasia, [and] capital punishment" (p.67), his argument based on sanctity remains entirely compatible with deliberative democracy that excludes appeals to pure revelation as a basis for making legitimate law -- for his argument, like MacIntyre's, is based on conceptual analysis and experience accessible to natural human intellect. Whether one agrees with his conclusions or not, this kind of argument for legal restrictions on personal liberties does not violate the implicit norms of deliberative democracy.

Although Jackson succeeds in defending inviolability for human beings without dignity in his sense or Kant's, and in arguing that dignity is practically unachievable without recognition of sanctity, he does not consider the possibility that sanctity may also depend on the potential for dignity. Part of our sanctity may be that we have as our natural telos the development of autonomous moral agency, the best state of which is precisely willed agapic devotion. Paul Weithman's short but excellent contribution emphasizes the importance of this idea for Christian thinkers. For us to know our "fundamental commitments," including commitments to God, to be "authentically" our own, we require basic civil rights (pp.96-97). This is because being assured that our commitments are our own requires reasonable expectation that they would survive critical scrutiny in light of adequate information about alternatives (p.104) (and, Weithman should add, adequate information about criticisms of the worldview underwriting our commitments, and responses to those criticisms). This is more convincing than Rawls's approach to establishing the necessity of basic civil rights (as abstract categories) for human dignity, because it looks existentially deeper. But for that reason, Weithman's approach obviously requires a complete conception of autonomy, authenticity, and the role played within these existential conditions by the will, practical reason, and moral freedom (the metaphysical liberty required for responsibility). For example, Weithman's claim that indoctrinated values can be autonomous if they would survive hypothetical critical reflection (p.103) would be contested among theorists from Sartre to Frankfurt, Gerald Dworkin, Susan Wolf, and Alfred Mele (to name a few).

That the justification of liberal democratic government cannot avoid these questions shows that it requires a robust philosophical anthropology for which Rawls's pragmatist "political" justification is insufficient. Rather, we need the resources of comprehensive conceptions of reason and freedom like those found in the Habermasian, existential, and Thomist traditions. Completing Weithman's project for grounding basic rights remains a large task!

Weithman's argument ends with the point that the kind of multifaceted relationship with God that characterizes living faith requires our assurance that our commitment is authentic, which in turn requires freedom from coercion. This point links nicely with Mark Murphy's critique of Thomas Hobbes's rejection of religious faith as a basis for refusing to obey legitimate human governments. As Murphy describes it, Hobbes's third (and best) argument that divine law cannot require us to violate human law depends on the idea that the human sovereign is a more reliable indicator of the right than our private consciences (p.144). Against this, Murphy argues that friendship with God, like all friendships, cannot be self-effacing (p.149). Weithman obviously agrees. But it might be replied that civic friendship is partly self-effacing, requiring some reciprocal willingness to accept the authority of collective decision-making. While it is not very plausible that a Hobbesian monarch is a reliable guide to ethical truth, the Jury Theorem says that this is much more plausible when the sovereign is a well-functioning deliberative democracy. The deliberative ideal makes room for collective judgments about the balance of private conscience and public authority (see Rawls on civil disobedience) and thus provides a way to solve Abraham Lincoln's dilemma about how to balance constitutionality with individual conscience. (Lincoln saw that the abolitionists had not solved this problem simply by appealing to a 'higher law,' even though he agreed with their moral judgment against slavery. He sought to articulate the moral presuppositions of legitimate popular sovereignty as a shared framework for American political understanding. None of Lincoln's central arguments were based on pure revelation.)

I have not fully discussed every author or major argument in this rich text, which repays careful reading. I would highly recommend the book not only for graduate seminars in political philosophy, but also for anyone interested in central topics in contemporary normative theory and moral psychology. I only hope that readers will consider seriously the plausible idea that democracy as a normative ideal of legitimate government is inconsistent with unlimited religious inclusivism in political discourse and political action.