Religion, Modernity and Politics in Hegel

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Thomas A. Lewis, Religion, Modernity and Politics in Hegel, Oxford University Press, 2011, 277 pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780199595594.

Reviewed by Andy German, Tel Aviv University


When studying a thinker like Hegel, who identifies the content of his Science of Logic with the "exposition of God as he is in his eternal essence, before the creation of nature and finite spirit", asking the question 'Quid sit deus?' is an elementary necessity. Broadly stated, Thomas Lewis' volume approaches this question along two main axes. First, he restores religion to a central place in Hegelian thought, thus offering a much-needed corrective to many readings which prefer to ignore it whenever possible (11). In this, Lewis succeeds admirably, giving his book a solid claim on the attention of all philosophers (not only Hegelians). His book should interest students of religion and politics as well, which leads us to the second axis.

Lewis argues that Hegel's conceptualization of religion, and the motivations behind it remain relevant today. In fact, Hegel's account of religion's place in the social order might be superior to any currently available alternatives -- near-total laïcité on the one hand or a theocratic public sphere, on the other (9-10, and 244-247).

Lewis locates himself among the new, Anglo-American Hegel interpreters, such as Robert Pippin and Terry Pinkard, who give us an essentially Kantian Hegel, one not interested in reviving rationalist metaphysics or a "monism" of "Spirit" as though Kant's first Critique were never written. This Kantian frame is crucial to Lewis' central argument that when Hegel speaks of "God" or "Spirit" (or, even worse, something called Absolute Spirit) he cannot, given Kant's annihilating critique of dogmatic metaphysics, be understood to mean some kind of super-human or theistic being. And when Hegel calls Christianity the "consummate" religion, the religion for the modern age, we cannot simply assume that he means what traditional Christians meant.

Hegel, then, is trying to make religion safe for modernity (and thereby, for democracy) (2). By drawing extensively on the early writings, Lewis shows, in Chapter 1, how the central problematic of modernity for Hegel was the loss of traditional social cohesion. Where, given the conditions of modernity, can we find a Volksreligion that would ensure the self-conscious identification of the majority of the population with the emerging new order?

For Hegel, however, such a Volksreligion can perform its cohesive function only so long as it does not contradict the critical spirit of the age; hence the need for a religion within the limits of pure (Hegelian) reason. Hegel's philosophical understanding of reason is elaborated in the second (and most technically intricate) chapter, followed by another on how religion fits into Hegel's whole project.

Lewis then embarks on a detailed exegesis of all the main ligatures of the Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion in Chapters 5, 6 and 7, followed by a closing section which engages the practical questions of religion in the modern state, its formative pedagogical role, and the potential for religious challenges to the modern order. Here we get the full view of Hegelian Volksreligion at work, as it were.

Many interpreters lop off some manageable element of Hegel's thinking (his aesthetics, say, or the master-slave dialectic) but politely ignore (= flee from) its supposedly impenetrable speculative core. Commendably, Lewis does not do this. He confronts that core, namely the Science of Logic, and insists on explaining Hegel's religious thinking in light of his famously difficult account of what it means for any entity to be determinate and intelligible at all.

Given his adherence to the "Kantian" interpretation, Lewis does not see Hegel's logic as the explication of the Absolute qua identity-within-difference of which both subject and object, or thought and being, are elements. This would entail a statement about the "ultimate nature of reality" (61), something no longer possible after Kant. Rather, Hegel's thought is immanent to, and extends the Kantian project (66) of, showing how all subjective relation to the world is essentially the function of the spontaneous activity of thought, while reconfiguring Kant's distinction between conceptual thinking and passive sensuous intuition.

All actuality, on this reading, is given to us only as already shot through with the conceptual spontaneity of thinking; i.e., there is no empirically or merely "given" sensuous manifold lying there, waiting for pure concepts of experience to come along and synthesize it. Our relation to the world is entirely determined by the immanent development of thought. Certainly, Hegel does not mean that reality is constituted by the idiosyncratic whims of any empirical individual. Rather, he broadens Kant's synthetic unity of apperception into a kind of historically and inter-subjectively constituted collective human subjectivity, or Spirit. Beyond such subjectivity, however, there is "no meta-theoretical account of the relation between the thinking subject and a world independent of that subject" (66).

This is no place to enter the lists in the burgeoning controversy over Hegel's philosophical intentions. One would have to interpret his entire system in order to hope to carry the argument. But since Lewis' book turns on the linkage between critical philosophy, critical religion and modernity, I add a brief remark about his interpretative frame.

Whatever one makes of Hegel, it seems to me that we make life much too easy for ourselves in describing the choice as one between some version of Kantianism in the one corner, and various bugaboos like a "cosmic mind", a "metaphysical" Absolute (67) entity, or "superhuman spirit" (93), in the other. Sometimes Lewis seems to argue that since Hegel can'tpossibly be about those things, the Absolute must be an essentially Kantian determination of what can possibly be given to thought, not what there is as such. So, for example, when Hegel refers to God, we are assured that this is not the "highest being" of something called "traditional metaphysics" (78). But this doesn't amount to much since the term "metaphysics" itself is radically ambiguous, and the tradition of metaphysics includes Greek and Christian conceptions of the deity, which are very far from classifiable under the same head.

In any case, showing the "centrality of the Kantian problems" to Hegel does not entail that the solutions must therefore also be Kantian. It simply does not follow that the only way out of Kant is backward, behind the Critique of Pure Reason, to something called "traditional metaphysics".[1] Perhaps, for example, Hegel found it necessary to combine Kant and Aristotle in a way neither would have thought possible?

In this context, however, let us limit ourselves to the question of what, and how much, of Hegel's treatment of religion this interpretation can reveal. As one example, I will focus on an exceptionally difficult issue: Hegel's treatment of "determinate", or historically existing religions.

On the one hand, Hegel attempts to map historical religions onto the various elements ("moments") of his concept of religion. Each religion manifests some limited part of this structure (180-181); the consummate religion manifests it in full. To this "conceptual mapping" however, Hegel adds another, and from Lewis' point of view, disastrous claim; namely, that he can trace the historical trajectory whereby these limited forms of religion emerged, were undermined by their own internal contradictions, and thus led to or called forth the next religion, in a necessary process which ends at the Christian terminus of religious history. Lewis finds this "narrative of genesis" to be the "most problematic, least defensible and most dated" (179) part of Hegel's thought. Conceptual and genetic analysis, "while not in tension, become incoherent, implausible and dangerous if combined into one" (180). The result is "off-putting" (186), perhaps even "ethnocentric" (179), in implying that all other religions are "limited, partial and finite", straining heroically toward Lutheran Christianity, as it were, only to fall on their faces.

As Lewis argues, the fact that each religion is only a finite manifestation of the whole concept need not mean that they appear historically in an exact order (181). Furthermore, Hegel never really got a firm grip on that order, as evidenced by his tinkering with it in the different manuscripts of the lectures (186).

One can certainly agree with much of this critique, but I would note that dispensing with the genetic account will do little to defend the honor of non-Christian religions. Hegel regularly insists that Spirit only returns to, or is "reconciled" with, itself in knowledge of the complete Concept. In religious terms, the concept is only completely manifest in Christianity, so that the situation for the other religions remains largely unchanged -- they are "inadequate" to the Concept, no matter their order of appearance. Lewis correctly notes that for all its seeming bombast, this claim involves nothing more than what is implied in asserting any view whatsoever, which necessarily commits us to the claim that it is "superior to any of the other alternatives of which we are aware" (186).

The question, of course, is how many alternative views one can be aware of. And here we come up against Hegel's central conceit -- namely, that once Spirit has passed through its whole historical development and then re-assimilated that development in the pure conceptual medium of the Logic, it achieves the definitive unification of the knowledge of history and knowledge of the intelligible ("logical") structure of history -- it knows all alternative views, all "shapes of Spirit".

The Begriff must manifest itself within history (otherwise it remains merely implicit or "in-itself"), but it must also be known in its manifestation. This cannot be known without someaccount of how it progressively actualized, and it is impossible to know that genesis as a progress unless one can look back at it from the point of view of its completion. We must stand at an "absolute" moment from which we can see that whatever course history takes from here it will not manifest essentially new forms of world-relation, new moments of the Concept, since there aren't any. The necessity of trying to work out the order of spiritual history, then, is not quite as dispensable as Lewis might like. It inheres in Hegel's attempt to reconcile temporal development with the circular (supra-temporal) completeness of the Concept, to achieve a God's-eye perspective.

Lewis, of course, would insist that this does not refer to some "transcendent, cosmic subject" (94). God is not "other" to man; He is human thinking or Spirit (12). But one could just as easily make the same point in reverse -- when finite human Spirit grasps itself fully, it becomes divine. It assumes the characteristics of both philosophical and Christian divinity. Like Aristotle's noêsis noêseôs, Spirit thinks itself. Unlike Aristotelian theos, however, it does not think itself to the exclusion of the world. In a sense much closer to the self-conscious God of the Bible, it thinks itself through being manifest within, through thinking, the whole natural and historical world. It is a question whether interpreting Hegel as not "ambitiously metaphysical" (59) allows one to grasp the magnitude of what he aims to accomplish.

I turn now to the "practical" question of religion's role in modern society, where Lewis' analysis opens our eyes to a much broader problem. Hegel was concerned that religion be a matter for a whole people, not just spiritual elites or religious virtuosos (77); the "broader population must find itself at home" in modernity (105). In fact, for Hegel, modernity is superior to antiquity precisely because the ancients were unable to incorporate free subjectivity into philosophy and collective life.

Religion, properly understood, can be the preeminent vehicle through which such a modern subjectivity is inculcated, because of its "emotional power". Its ability to console, to educate, to express imagistically the highest aspirations and ideals of a people, absolutely surpasses the capacity of philosophical thought. Modern religion, then, must be at once post-critical and yet fulfill the heart, senses and imagination (28), thus taking its place as a constituent element in Absolute Spirit. Spirit becomes "Absolute" when it has itself for its own object, when it knows itself as the truth via art, religion, and philosophy. Each of these modes of self-knowledge, however, embodies a different kind of cognition and here an interesting tension emerges.

On the one hand, Hegel wants to demonstrate the agreement between philosophical reason and an actually existing religious tradition (122), not some abstraction. Lutheran Christianity, and the religious community constituted by its faith and praxis, is the content of philosophy grasped in representational thought. Philosophy takes this content up into proper conceptual thought, but the content, says Hegel, "remains always the same".

It is, however, of the very essence of representational thought that it cannot fully contain the truth (206). The insufficiency of the vessel forces Spirit onward into the realm of conceptual cognition, or philosophy. But not everyone can follow this path to its conclusion. Most, in fact, never become philosophers (251). Although the philosophical impetus animates Christianity to a degree higher than any other religion, the overwhelming majority of its adherents will remain at a level below the highest spiritual reconciliation. In Lewis' thought-provoking formulation: "An uncritically appropriated Christianity and a philosophical justification . . . function in tandem and hold together a complex new form of life" -- modernity (204, 231).

Religion's role in holding modernity together is thus both indispensable and subordinate. The consummate religion does not dictate law or policy. Instead, according to Lewis, it only cultivates "dispositions corresponding to broad orientation" (246) -- such as a concern with subjective freedom (for Hegel, a central advantage of Protestantism (241)). Religion prepares citizens to see themselves, and their own interests, reflected in the institutions of the state (240). At this level of generality, however, there is not much to sink one's teeth into. What does this mean in practice?

Because representation cannot grasp its content fully, it remains possible that the particular practices and institutions of even the consummate religion, when understood non-philosophically (as they inevitably will be by most people), might conflict with philosophy (or the state). Lewis even provides an "up-to-date" example: "One danger of misconstruing the relation between religion and the state lies . . . in basing the legal code on specific religious commandments. Purportedly literal readings of the Bible, for instance, could be seen as warrants for banning same-sex marriage" (238). Such a reading would reflect a failure to grasp the representational nature of religious language, a failure to understand that the "objective standpoint [i.e. philosophy] is alone capable of bearing witness to . . . spirit."[2]

How, then, do we neutralize the rather knock-on effect of texts like Leviticus 18:22 or 20:13? Hegel's answer is clear: "Thinking is the absolute judge before which the content [of religion] must verify and attest its claims".[3] Where the "contingent and accidental" elements of religion (252), the encrustations of representational thought, conflict with true philosophical content, philosophy (or its objective manifestation, the state) clarifies the true interpretation of Scripture. As Lewis puts it, we must simply read the text "symbolically", not "literally". And here, it seems clear that we have walked straight into a minefield.

I am not referring to Lewis' fears that Hegel's thought might justify the authoritarian oppression of religion (243). My concern is rather with the coherence of Absolute Spirit, and hence of modernity. Is it quite so simple a matter to prune the content of religious doctrine, ritual and scripture, when these same elements are the source of religion's emotional, and hence cohesive, power?

For Hegel, there can be no fundamental conflict of interest here since "the content of philosophy, its need and interest, is wholly in common with that of religion".[4] However, only philosophy, not religion, truly grasps this commonality. Philosophy encompasses the religious standpoint and religious interest within the whole, but the religious believer does notascend to the philosophical standpoint. This means that to the extent that most people are not philosophical, they cannot see, cannot identify with, the philosophical reinterpretation of (or intervention in) religious belief and practice. But what happens to the vaunted social and educative function of Volksreligion when this incommensurability of horizons bursts into consciousness?

A potentially fundamental conflict of interest, an unsublated contradiction, infects the Absolute. Philosophy must wear two hats -- it is both fidei defensor and defensor pacis. But this is possible only if there is absolutely no "undigested" disjunction between theory and practice, representation and thinking, faith and knowledge. The distinction between the Concept as manifested in art, religion and politics and its comprehension by philosophy means that such a disjunction persists.

To borrow from Karl Löwith's assessment of Nietzsche, Hegel repeats antiquity at the very peak of modernity but not as he might have wanted. For Absolute Spirit reenacts the same tension in Plato's Republic which Hegel had criticized in his own Philosophy of Right -- namely, the irreconcilable chasm between the public sphere and the private, non-political character of Greek philosophy. When Socrates and Plato's brothers construct the perfect city, they must ruthlessly supervise the "makers of tales" about the gods (R, 377b). Ultimately, however, since, as Socrates says, a "multitude cannot be philosophic", there is no hope of a completely philosophic reconstruction of religion. The "founding of temples, sacrifices, and whatever else belongs to the care of gods" must be left to the "ancestral interpreter" (R., 427b).

In Hegel's philosophy too, as Lewis notes with some dismay, philosophers will always be the minority, the rest are "left with" religion (251, cf. 231). Lewis finds this to be in "fundamental tension" with Hegel's "philosophical anthropology" (ibid). But perhaps I can suggest - in closing and as a token of the serious reflection which Lewis' book requires - a more charitable interpretation. This tension is quite consonant with, indeed an inevitable and most instructive result of, Hegel's unprecedented ambition: to unite philosophy as the highest, and rarest, of spiritual accomplishments with the destiny of humanity as a whole.

[1] As Lewis himself admits in a footnote (65, n. 19): “…we by no means need to choose simply between Pippin’s interpretation and a pre-critical metaphysics.”

[2] VPR, 3:268.

[3] Ibid, n. 265

[4] VPR, 1:63.  And cf. Lewis, 113-122, 160 and 229.