Removing the Commons: A Lockean Left-Libertarian Approach to the Just Use and Appropriation of Natural Resources

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Eric Roark, Removing the Commons: A Lockean Left-Libertarian Approach to the Just Use and Appropriation of Natural Resources, Lexington Books, 2013, 184pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739174685.

Reviewed by Avery Kolers, University of Louisville


Left-libertarianism has come of age in recent years, and the debates among libertarians left and right -- and between libertarians and others -- have enriched not only the Lockean tradition but political philosophy in general.

Eric Roark's contribution to this ferment is welcome and urgent, and merits attention from both libertarians and others. The practical payoff of his book is in its implications for two of the gravest injustices we face: persistent global poverty and the worsening environmental emergency. The intellectual machinery required for this payoff is an often ingenious argument regarding the conditions under which Lockean self-owners can really be said to be equal and independent, and the terms upon which the condition of initial common ownership of the Earth can be overcome by individual users and appropriators.

Nearly all contemporary libertarians, left and right, agree that individual persons are robust "self-owners," and that consequently each person is entitled to live her own life without interference unless violating the rights of others (58). With a few exceptions, the two sides also agree that private ownership is limited by a "Lockean Proviso" -- that appropriators must leave "enough and as good" for others. But the two sides part ways there, with left-libertarians interpreting the proviso much more robustly:

if an agent appropriates for herself a natural resource that was once part of the shared common stock, then she owes others with whom the thing was once shared some non-trivial duty (63).

Roark's principal contribution is to take seriously not just appropriation, but also use. While use is difficult to define -- Roark makes an attempt in an appendix (171-4) -- all Roark needs is a sufficient condition, and a clear distinction between use and appropriation. For Roark, "use" is a descriptive term, and physical impingement is a sufficient condition (74). In contrast, "appropriation" is a normative term: there is no such thing as wrongful appropriation, because one who violates the Lockean Proviso in attempting to appropriate fails to appropriate at all. And whatever else is required, claiming is a necessary condition of appropriation. Thus, all physical impingements unaccompanied by claims of private ownership (or in violation of the proviso) are mere uses.

The proviso must limit unilateral appropriation because unilateral appropriation removes everyone else's moral liberty to use or access the appropriated object. But, as Roark notes, unilateral use unilaterally removes everyone else's effective liberty to use the object at the same time. And this removal of liberties is no less problematic for being nonappropriative; indeed, as Roark notes, what is really morally problematic about excessive appropriations, even for Locke, is that they do not leave enough and as good for others to use.

It may seem that such uses already count as Lockean appropriations, and so Roark's concern is misplaced. After all, Locke thinks merely grabbing an apple suffices for appropriation;[1] hence there is no nonappropriative use of unowned resources. But Locke never imagines that every blade of grass that my foot lands on as I approach the apple tree is thereby appropriated. Nor does Locke consider Roark's strange cases of people who build walls around unowned resources or hide them from others without appropriating them. If a Lockean Proviso applies to appropriation, it should apply to use.

This shift has two powerful implications, one for self-ownership and one for the proviso. First, being a self-owner is not worth much if you lack the capacity to use yourself, and in order to do that you have to have access to yourself. Suppose that A owns land wholly surrounded by B's land, or A's land is at the end of a private road that B owns; in this situation, where A needs to cross B's land in order to access her own land, A has a claim right against B, within reason, not to impede her access (76). That is, access trumps exclusion. Roark draws the following implication: a person can have a claim-right to access natural resources that are unowned or owned by others in order to gain access to her self. And since a self is not just a physical body but a living, breathing, metabolizing animal, access to the self requires air, water, and food sufficient for survival. Just as a "nefarious nurse" who smothers a patient thereby attacks that patient's self-ownership, so does someone who makes the air noxious (82-5). Self-ownership, then, requires not a person-shaped boundary forbidding only nonconsensual physical contact, but a bubble that includes the oxygen, water, and other basic physical necessities required for each to be able to use the self that she owns. Thus, a robust commitment to self-ownership limits what private property owners can do even prior to the Lockean Proviso.

The Lockean Proviso is the site of the second major change wrought by taking use seriously. Contrary to right-libertarians such as Robert Nozick,[2] left-libertarians think, first, that mere improvements in welfare cannot offset the loss of liberty constituted by another's appropriation -- what must be left is, in some sense, "enough and as good" liberty; and second, that the relative contribution of natural resources to the value of finished goods is far greater than the 1/1000 share that Locke (in)famously ascribes to it.[3] Roark very plausibly notes that current market prices for natural resources are an extremely poor basis for taking the right-libertarian position on this question, since commodity pricing fails to include the preferences of the "bottom billion" (151, 153) and does nothing to ensure that enough will be left for the future. What's required is to charge both users and appropriators the "full competitive value" of the resources they put off-limits to others both at the moment of initial use or appropriation, and "on an on-going basis" (162-3).

These are important implications that take seriously the arguments -- often made on libertarian or Lockean turf -- by authors such as Tim Hayward, Thomas Pogge, Kristin Shrader-Frechette, and Christopher Stone, who insist that current capitalist institutions violate the proviso or actively harm poor and future people.[4]

But what does "enough and as good" require? Differences on this question have animated a great deal of debate among Lockeans. Using Michael Otsuka's version of the proviso as a foil, Roark powerfully defends an

Equal Initial Opportunity for Welfare Georgism Proviso: You can use an unappropriated natural resource X if and only if you leave others their initial equal opportunity for welfare share of the competitive rent value of the effective liberty to use X (in the precise fashion that you use X). (128)

To make out this baseline, Roark imagines a hypothetical Vickrey auction (115) where parties bid precisely specified effective liberties to use natural resources and aspects of their selves. Thus, for instance, if I want to use a particular bog to gather wild cranberries on Tuesday the 12th from 5:00 a.m. to 7:00 a.m., I might bid my liberty to use that same bog from 7:00 a.m. to 8:00 a.m. on the same day, plus my labor during that hour. If you lose out to me on the earlier time in the bog, you might still win the next hour on that bog plus my labor for that hour, and hence I will spend that hour gathering cranberries for you. The auction requires a few more specifications to ensure equal bidding power and that "enough and as good" does not discriminate against those who are through no fault of their own less efficient at converting resources into welfare, but the result is a proviso on use -- later adapted for appropriation -- that is a legitimate contender for a general theory of equal opportunity.

Whether right-libertarians should accept Roark's arguments seems to me an open question. There are two most fundamental problems here. First, it's not clear how much light there actually is between the two positions. As noted above, Roark characterizes left-libertarians as insisting on "some non-trivial duty" concomitant to use or appropriation. Right-libertarians would, however, surely agree; they just think that free markets reliably discharge that duty. Moreover, like right-libertarians, Roark accepts "inequality, even vast inequality" (157), provided it is grounded in differential returns to labor, not natural resources. And right-libertarians could accept most of Roark's criticisms of unjust past appropriations. Thus, the payoff of specifically left-libertarianism remains unclear.

Second, and perhaps more important, left-libertarianism seems to collapse into right-libertarianism. The problem is as follows. Roark defends a "Payment" version of the proviso, as against a "No-Payment" version, the difference being that the latter forbids currency conversion, requiring "enough and as good" of the exact same kind of thing that is removed (111). Roark justifies the "Payment" proviso thusly:

consider a scenario in which everyone's initial "enough and as good share" is very slight . . . If, however, one super-genius agent is allowed to use most of the natural resources, then he can manage the resources in ways which benefit everyone ten-fold . . . A No-Payment Lockean Proviso maintains that this super-genius is not at liberty to unilaterally use a vast share of natural resources and in so doing greatly improve everyone's life . . . the right result [is] that an agent may use unappropriated natural resources as she wishes so long as she makes a payment that leaves others enough and as good. (111)

Here the difference between poverty and wealth causally depends on the possibility of substitution. Let us grant -- what is not obvious -- that this is a good argument for the Payment version of the proviso. We can construct a parallel case undermining left-libertarianism. Consider a scenario in which one's "Initial Equal Opportunity Georgist Proviso share" is very slight. If, however, one super-genius is allowed to reap the competitive value not just of her labor, but also of the natural resources she removes from the common, then she can manage the resources in ways that benefit everyone ten-fold. Left-libertarianism maintains that this super-genius is not at liberty to unilaterally reap the competitive value of natural resources and in so doing greatly improve everyone's life.

If the first argument defeats No-Payment provisos, why does the second argument not defeat left-libertarianism? The second case seems no less empirically plausible than the first. In each case, a prima facie wrongful unilateral taking of other persons' liberties is made right by the payoff of greater liberties (of some other form) to the victims. The perpetrator is not required to seek consent; the victims have no case because the perpetrator has objectively improved their situation. Therefore, left-libertarianism collapses into right-libertarianism, because, having accepted the unilateral removal-and-replacement of others' rights, left-libertarians have no basis for prohibiting one more transaction of the same kind.

Roark's discussion faces some deeper problems. Three of the key terms in the theory -- self, use, and natural resources -- are inadequately defined. I focus here only on the latter two. As noted above, Roark offers "physical impingement" as a sufficient condition of use, and in the appendix adds a "plans and projects" disjunct (174). And throughout, he uses "removal" to cover both use and appropriation, since uses remove effective liberties and appropriations remove moral liberties. But many acts that intuitively seem to be uses -- including environmental harms -- fall outside these categories. If I consume more than a per-capita equal share of ecospace, I do not, on my own, remove anyone's liberties. The harm begins when we collectively do so. Roark suggests that bidders in the Vickrey auction could pool their bids (166), and perhaps he would have to regard these collective harms as de facto cases of pooled bids. But it is not obvious that his proposed auction could coherently tolerate cooperative bidding, and even if it can, it's not clear that this practice would yield desirable results. The cooperative bids of would-be resource-protectors might be overwhelmed by those of resource-exploiters.

Deeper problems afflict Roark's notion of natural resources. Roark uses a simple tripartite division: "Every physical object can be placed within one of three categories: (1) beings with moral standing, (2) natural resources, or (3) artifacts. There is nothing in the physical world, remarkable as it might be, that falls outside of these three categories" (27). Apart from obvious boundary problems, this conception of resources is inadequate. In the first instance there are things like relationships, processes, and capacities that are not objects. An auction model will distort these by breaking them into individual lots. Maybe some aspects of the global commons ought to be off-limits, some aspects tied to other aspects and auctioned as a package, and so on. Roark seems to envision the identities of lots being determined by the fact of someone's bidding on them. I'm not sure this is helpful in a hypothetical auction, but suppose it is; even so, the actual resources then turn out not to be objects in the world but precisely specified effective liberties (or their exercise). What we buy at auction are other people's liberties; what we bid are our own.

Which objects anyone will bid for the effective liberty to use depends on technology, culture, known availability, and price. So is the auction to be run once for all time, or will it be revisable as new "resources" come into existence? Roark's proposal of an ongoing proviso seems to require him to say that the auction is revisable; if someone bids on land cheaply, but then finds oil there, its value goes up, and consequently more is owed through the proviso. But suppose a traditional farming village unexpectedly finds itself sitting atop a valuable oil deposit. The villagers are suddenly required to pay up or ship out. They cannot insist on the right to stay put and leave the oil in the ground, because others, acting individually or in concert, would bid top-dollar for the effective liberty to access this oil, and the villagers would consequently have to pay to stay.[5] The fact that when they settled there this resource was unknown or unreachable -- and that they do not now want it -- is irrelevant, given the ongoing proviso. But if Roark switches back to a one-time-only proviso, then massive inequalities in inherited resource endowments come roaring back in.

Roark has made a valuable contribution. The conception of access to the self is a powerful means of building subsistence rights into the libertarian framework. And the Georgist Proviso with equal bidding power is a tour de force. Both of these elements embody an attention to use, as distinct from appropriation, which should be a required extra step in any theory that begins with initial common ownership. There is much more to appreciate here, not least of which is the serious libertarian engagement with global poverty and environmental destruction. Roark's book should be required reading for Lockeans and libertarians, and is well worth the attention of others. The problems raised in this review are offered as spurs to further work in an extremely promising vein.[6]

[1] John Locke, Two Treatises of Government (Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1988).

[2] Robert Nozick, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (New York: Basic Books, 1974).

[3] Locke, Two Treatises of Government. For defense of Locke on this ratio see Daniel Russell, "Locke on Land and Labor," Philosophical Studies (2002).

[4] See Tim Hayward, "Global Justice and the Distribution of Natural Resources," Political Studies 54 (2006); Thomas W. Pogge, "Eradicating Systemic Poverty: Brief for a Global Resources Dividend," Journal of Human Development 2, no. 1 (2001); Kristin Shrader-Frechette, Environmental Justice (New York: Oxford University Press, 2002); Christopher D. Stone, Should Trees Have Standing?, 3rd ed. (New York: Oxford University Press, 2010).

[5] Avery Kolers, "Justice, Territory and Natural Resources," Political Studies 60, no. 2 (2012).

[6] I am grateful to Karen Christopher, Andrew Jason Cohen, and Eric Roark for discussion of this review.