Representation and Reality in Wittgenstein's Tractatus

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José L. Zalabardo, Representation and Reality in Wittgenstein's Tractatus, Oxford University Press, 2015, 263pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198743941.

Reviewed by Jinho Kang, Seoul National University


José L. Zalabardo's book provides a rich and stimulating interpretation of Wittgenstein's central doctrines in the Tractatus about the nature of representation and the structure of reality. As is well known, the Tractatus raises peculiar difficulties for an attempt to spell out its "doctrines", for Wittgenstein notoriously declares toward the end of the book that anyone who understands him will eventually recognize its statements as nonsensical (6.54). Zalabardo is well aware of the problems raised by 6.54 and of the debates between traditional readers, who have tended to downplay the supposed nonsensicality of the Tractarian statements, and more recent "resolute" readers who have taken it seriously and attempted to develop an anti-theoretical, therapeutic reading of the Tractatus. Still, Zalabardo provides a more or less straightforward interpretation of "the Tractarian Account of Representation and Reality (TARR)" (p.7). He is able to do so because he divides what he calls "Wittgenstein's programme" (p.2) in the Tractatus into two stages and focuses on a reconstruction and evaluation of only the first stage.

According to Zalabardo, the first stage of this programme consists in recognizing that TARR provides the only viable solutions to the philosophical problems it addresses and that these solutions entail their own nonsensicality. This paradoxical result leads us to the second stage of "Wittgenstein's programme", in which we recognize that, since TARR provides the only possible solutions, the paradox has been compelled by the very rules that define our enterprise of seeking solutions to philosophical problems. We accordingly recognize the illegitimacy of philosophical problems while rejecting those rules, which again leads us to the ultimate realization that our initial "recognition" of the unique correctness and nonsensicality of TARR was itself an illusion. Now, Zalabardo argues that Wittgenstein has in fact failed to complete the first stage: TARR does not provide the only viable solutions to the philosophical problems, and they do not entail their own nonsensicality. Since we can undertake the second stage of "Wittgenstein's programme" only by completing the first, Zalabardo concludes that the real significance of the Tractatus is not its distinctive conception of philosophical problems as illegitimate but the enduring plausibility of its doctrines.

If Zalabardo is correct that something like "Wittgenstein's programme" is operating in the Tractatus, then we can approach its statements just as traditional readers did in so far as we are engaging in the first stage of the programme. Also, if he is correct that Wittgenstein has failed to accomplish the first stage, it turns out that traditional readers have been right about how we should read the Tractatus, although "resolute" readers have been right about how Wittgenstein intended us to read the book. This strikes me as an ingenious way to find a middle ground between traditional and "resolute" readings, although I doubt that the early Wittgenstein really had a conception of the "rules" that define the philosophical enterprise. But I do not want to push the doubt further here, for the related issues are largely beyond the scope of Zalabardo's book. I will thus tentatively assume the existence of "Wittgenstein's programme". Zalabardo claims that the two stages of this programme correspond to the actual evolution of Wittgenstein's thought. In particular, he argues that Wittgenstein originally regarded philosophical problems as genuine ones and developed TARR with a conviction that it provides the only viable solutions. Since Zalabardo believes that a proper understanding of this development holds the key for interpreting TARR, he devotes a substantial part of the book to relevant investigations.

On Zalabardo's construal, TARR involves three main components, each of which corresponds to a specific set of philosophical problems Wittgenstein was wrestling with in the early period. The first component is the doctrine that propositions are truth-functions of elementary propositions. The second is the picture theory as it is primarily applied to elementary propositions. The third is an account of the structure of reality according to which the basic units of the world are facts, not objects. In Chapters 1-3, Zalabardo provides an interpretation of the second component of TARR first, the picture theory, by considering how Russell's view on judgment evolves from the dual-relation theory to the multiple-relation theory of judgment (MRTJ), how Wittgenstein develops the picture theory as the solution to the problems he finds in MRTJ, and how his objection to MRTJ contributes to the conclusion that propositions cannot represent cognitive relations between the subject and the world. In Chapters 4-5, Zalabardo provides an interpretation of the third component of TARR, fact-based metaphysics, by considering how Wittgenstein develops it as the solution to the problem of the unity of the fact and how it imposes limitations on the representational capacity of propositions. Finally, in Chapter 6, Zalabardo provides an interpretation of the first component of TARR, the analysis of propositions as truth-functions of elementary propositions, by considering how Wittgenstein develops it as the solution to the problem of understanding our knowledge of logical relations among propositions.

Described at this general level, there seems to be little new in Zalabardo's interpretation of TARR. It is well known that Wittgenstein apparently presents the picture theory, the fact-based metaphysics, and truth-functional analysis of propositions in the Tractatus. Also, a fair number of scholars have already investigated the origins of these doctrines roughly along the lines suggested by Zalabardo. This means that we should find the originality and strength of Zalabardo's book mainly in its details. And here his book does excel. It offers novel accounts for a number of topics, among which the following are particularly interesting: an interpretation of the precise role of Russellian forms in MRTJ; a proposal about the connection between Wittgenstein's "nonsense" objection to MRTJ and unsayability of cognitive relations; a distinction between lower-level and higher-level analysis in the picture theory; an interpretation of Wittgenstein's "general form of the proposition" as an expression of the pictorial nature of the proposition; a construal of Tractarian objects and names as "common characteristic marks"; an analysis of the possible in the Tractatus in terms of the actual; an analysis of the Tractarian argument for substance based on an interpretation of substance as form; an examination of the possibility of higher-order predication in the Tractatus; a "contextual" definition of elementary propositions and a discussion of its problems. Moreover, Zalabardo develops these accounts with intricate textual analysis and with painstaking arguments that can rarely be found in other monographs on the Tractatus.

In this review, I can discuss only some of the topics Zalabardo addresses. I will focus on his interpretations of Russell's MRTJ and Wittgenstein's picture theory. In the early version of MRTJ, the subject makes a judgment by being multiply related to the constituents of the judged complex; for example, Smith's false judgment that Plato respects Kant is analyzed as Judge (Smith, Plato, respect, Kant). This analysis has an advantage of not requiring us to posit a non-existent complex Plato's respecting Kant, but it invites the problem of explaining the unity revealed in what is judged by the subject. It has been suggested that Russell introduces "forms" in MRTJ to solve the problem of unity. But Zalabardo subtly disagrees. According to him, the required unity is achieved for Russell by the subject's capacity to unite the constituents into a complex in thought. This answer, however, raises what Zalabardo calls the "mode-of-combination problem", namely the problem of explaining how the subject can grasp the way the constituents should be combined. According to Zalabardo, Russell introduces forms in MRTJ to solve this problem. In particular, he proposes that Russell's form is a constituent of the complex produced by the subject in thought while not being a constituent of the judged complex in the world. So, for example, Smith's true judgment that Plato respects Socrates is now analyzed as Judge (Smith, Plato, respect, Socrates, (∃x, y, φ)xφy), in which the form (∃x, y, φ)xφy occurs as a constituent. (I believe that Russell's form in this case should be xφy, but I cannot pursue the issue). Zalabardo's claim is that this form is not a constituent of the judged complex Plato's respecting Socrates, and thus that the complex produced by the subject in thought is different from the judged complex. This difference is crucial for Zalabardo, for he argues that it enables Russell to solve the problem of unity and the "mode-of-combination problem" in MRTJ without embracing an absurd conclusion that the subject can literally create a judged complex through unification.

Zalabardo's interpretation of the role of Russell's forms in MRTJ is fresh and forceful, but it has a problem. It is not clear whether Zalabardo means that a form does not occur in a judged complex at all or that it does occur in a judged complex but only as a way of combination and not as a constituent. On several occasions Zalabardo writes as if he meant the first, but it strikes me as implausible because Russell talks about a judged complex "having" its form in many passages. Zalabardo may mean the second, which fits better with what Russell is saying. But it now invites the vexing question whether the form occurring as a constituent in the judging complex is identical with the form occurring as a way in the judged complex. If they are identical, then what Zalabardo proposes as Russell's solution to the "mode-of-combination problem" does not work, for it would imply that the judging complex and the judged complex are also identical and hence that the subject can indeed create a judged complex. If the two forms are not identical, however, then it becomes mysterious how they could count as the same form. In sum, Zalabardo's interpretation of Russell's form and its role seems to face a problem in either construal.

I now turn to Zalabardo's interpretation of the picture theory. He takes its "central idea" (p.46) to be the following: a proposition is a fact that is different from the fact it represents, but it nevertheless shares the logical form with the represented fact in that the expressions in it are combined in the same way as the correlated elements of the represented fact should be combined. Zalabardo provides a detailed discussion of how Wittgenstein develops this idea as the alternative solution to the "mode-of-combination problem" and how it answers the remaining difficulties of MRTJ.

What Zalabardo takes as the central idea of the picture theory plays an undoubtedly important role in the account of propositions Wittgenstein developed in "Notes on Logic" (NL) and "Moore Notes" (MN) in 1913-14. Also, one of Wittgenstein's motivations for this account must have been to find the solution to the problems of MRTJ. However, it seems clear to me that the chief motivation for Wittgenstein's account of propositions in NL and MN was to find the solution to the problems regarding the nature of logic, which had been the central concern for him in 1912-13, for he came to think that the proper understanding of the nature of propositions held the key for solving those problems. Seen from this perspective, the central idea in Wittgenstein's account of propositions in NL and MN is the bi-polarity of the proposition, namely the feature that a proposition is both capable of being true and capable of being false due to its sense. For it is the bi-polarity of the proposition that enables Wittgenstein to provide the solution or dissolution to the problems regarding the nature of logic by showing that expressions for logical constants and logical principles can all be eliminated in a logically perspicuous notation such as his "ab-notation" in NL and MN or TF-notation in the Tractatus. By unduly focusing on Wittgenstein's reactions to MRTJ, Zalabardo presents a somewhat distorted picture of his account of propositions.

More controversially, I think that the central idea of the picture theory is different from any of those we can find in NL or MN. I take it that this theory is a result of the development of Wittgenstein's thought after he composed NL and MN, which makes good sense of his recollection that the idea of a proposition as a picture initially occurred to him in the fall of 1914. In my view, the central idea of the picture theory is that the sense of a proposition is entirely determined by the logical form it shares with the fact it represents. This idea is what enables Wittgenstein to assert in the Tractatus that "A proposition shows its sense" (4.022; emphasis original), whereas sense was not among the features "shown" by a proposition in NL or MN. But the standard notion of logical form would be too weak to provide a proposition with its sense. I thus think that the notion of logical form in Wittgenstein's picture theory is a "global" one in that it is determined by the role of a proposition in the inferential network of all propositions. It seems to me that this total inferential network of propositions is what Wittgenstein means by "logical space" when he remarks that "A picture presents a situation in logical space" (2.11) or that "a proposition reaches through the whole of logical space" (3.42). For example, two propositions "aRb" and "cLd" have the same local logical form, namely the binary relation form, but have different global logical forms given that "aRb" implies "aRb", "(∃x)xRb", "(∃φ)aφb", etc. while "cLd" does not. This difference between the global logical form of "aRb" and that of "cLd" can be shown by the difference between two propositional variables "xφy" and "zψu" in the Tractatus, for Wittgenstein stipulates that different variables cannot be assigned the same object. If the notion of logical form in the picture theory is global, the picturing relation must be global, too: "aRb" and "cLd" are pictures of different facts, aRb and cLd, although they have the same local logical form, because they have different global logical forms.

Along with other commentators, however, Zalabardo takes it for granted that the notion of logical form in the picture theory is the standard, local one. This assumption makes it hard to see how non-elementary propositions such as "~aRb" and "aRb ∨ cLd" could be pictures of facts, for one of the fundamental ideas in the Tractatus is that there is no such thing as a separate negative fact ~aRb or a disjunctive fact aRb ∨ cLd over and above aRb and cLd. It is no wonder, then, that Zalabardo concludes that Wittgenstein's picture theory "faces serious difficulties" (p.186) when it comes to non-elementary propositions. I think that these "difficulties" are Zalabardo's own making, created by his flawed understanding of Wittgenstein's picture theory.

With the assumption that the notion of logical form is local for Wittgenstein, Zalabardo proposes that "The way in which the constituents of a fact are combined with one another . . .is the logical form of the fact" (p.52; my emphasis). If the logical form of a proposition in the picture theory is global, however, then logical form cannot be the way the expressions occurring in a proposition are actually combined with one another. Rather, logical form must be the possibility of the structural feature of a proposition that is revealed by all combinatorial possibilities of the expressions occurring in it, the latter possibilities being determined by the inferential relations of the proposition to all propositions. I believe that what Wittgenstein calls the "form" of a name is none other than such combinatorial possibilities. My belief makes good sense of the Tractarian distinction between form and structure, while I doubt that Zalabardo could.

Zalabardo's actualist account of the logical form of a proposition leads him to adopt a version of actualist account of the form of a name, which again raises a difficulty for his otherwise insightful interpretation of Tractarian names. Zalabardo claims that names in the Tractatus encompass all kinds of n-ary predicates as well as proper names, and also that they are not components of propositions but rather common features shared by the propositions in which they occur. Both claims seem correct to me. More specifically, however, Zalabardo suggests that, for example, the first name occurring in the proposition "aRb" is not the sign "a" but the feature consisting in "a" bearing some binary relation to some individual. This suggestion is problematic, for it would then follow that "aRb" and "cSa" would have no common name given that the relevant feature of "aRb", namely consisting in "a" bearing some binary relation to some individual, is different from the relevant feature of "cSa", namely consisting in some individual bearing some binary relation to "a". As Zalabardo observes, we could avoid this absurd consequence by characterizing the name in a more general way, for instance the feature consisting in "a" satisfying some universal. But this move now conflicts with Wittgenstein's replacement of Russellian type restrictions with the syntactical constraints provided by the forms of names in the Tractatus, for such replacement requires that a name must be maximally specific with regard to its form (cf. 3.333). Zalabardo thus concludes that Wittgenstein's account of names in the Tractatus faces "an important difficulty" (p.128). Again, however, this difficulty seems to be Zalabardo's own making due to his flawed understanding of Wittgenstein's notion of form. The specification of the form of a name must include all of its combinatorial possibilities. Accordingly, the feature that plays the role of the first name in "aRb" is not what Zalabardo suggests, but the feature consisting in "a" having the possibilities of exemplifying some property, of bearing some binary relation to some individual, of some individual bearing some binary relation to it, etc. Since this feature is maximally specific with regard to its form and also common to both "aRb" and "cSa", the difficulty pointed out by Zalabardo does not arise.

These criticisms notwithstanding, I think that Zalabardo's book is overall a valuable contribution to the existing literature on the Tractatus with many illuminating discussions and careful arguments. It must be read by anyone who is seriously interested in Wittgenstein's early philosophy.