Representation and Scepticism from Aquinas to Descartes

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Han Thomas Adriaenssen, Representation and Scepticism from Aquinas to Descartes, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 279pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107181625.

Reviewed by Dominik Perler, Humbolt-Universität zu Berlin


It has often been argued that many early modern philosophers were deeply concerned about the "veil of ideas" problem. How can we ever have cognitive access to things in the material world if the only objects we immediately apprehend are ideas in our mind? Aren't material things hidden behind this veil of ideas? Medieval philosophers seem to have discussed a similar problem, which might be called the "veil of species" problem. How can we ever cognize material things if the only objects we immediately apprehend are intelligible species in our intellect? Can we ever go beyond species and grasp the material things themselves? At first sight, it looks as if early modern authors simply rephrased the medieval problem. It is therefore not surprising that a number of scholars pointed out similarities, drawing parallels between scholastic and Cartesian debates. However, there has been no attempt to compare the two debates and to look at dissimilarities as well as similarities. Adriaenssen's impressive study fills this gap. It carefully reconstructs epistemological debates in the late medieval and the early modern periods and convincingly shows that the problem of representation was indeed at stake in both periods. But it also makes clear that scholastic and Cartesian authors were driven by different motivations and tackled different problems, rather than one general veil problem.

The author reaches this conclusion after first examining scholastic sources (chs. 1-3), then discussing Cartesian and anti-Cartesian texts (chs. 4-6), and finally comparing them (chs. 7-8). The title of the book is a bit misleading, since it is not a study of debates from Aquinas to Descartes. It goes beyond Descartes by looking at authors such as Malebranche, Arnauld, Desgabet and Sergeant. This is precisely what makes this book innovative; it leaves trodden paths of research. A more suitable (but presumably less marketable) title would have been "From Aristotelians to Cartesians and Back Again," for the study starts with species theories as they were discussed by Aquinas, Olivi, Aureol and Ockham, then looks at various Cartesian theories of ideas, and ends with Sergeant, who attacked Cartesians by returning to what he called "solid philosophy," which was nothing but an Aristotelian account of cognition.

The book is in many respects original. Let me mention three points that are particularly stimulating and important for future research. The first concerns scholastic controversies over species. In recent years, a number of scholars (e.g., Katherine Tachau, Leen Spruit, Robert Pasnau) have shown that a series of authors, ranging from Olivi to Ockham, rejected the widespread opinion that species are indispensable for cognition. It is clear that each of these authors wanted to replace the species theory with some other theory that stresses our immediate access to material things. But it is less clear how exactly that replacement theory is supposed to go. Here Adriaenssen offers new insights. He shows that there was a wide range of alternatives to the traditional theory. Olivi claimed that acts of perception are immediately directed at external things, but he still accepted species for acts of memory. Aureol rejected even these species, emphasizing instead that all acts are immediately directed at things with "objective appearance." But he still subscribed to the idea that cognition has a relational structure. Ockham broke even with this idea, claiming that no cognitive act needs to stand in a special relation to an object. All that is required for these acts is an internal structure. Or as Adriaenssen puts it, "a suitably configured act of the soul suffices for the engagement with present and absent objects alike" (p. 118). Adriaenssen thereby convincingly shows that it would be too simple to speak about a uniform doctrine of direct realism that was developed in opposition to the traditional species theory. There were different forms of direct realism, both relational and non-relational ones.

A second point is particularly illuminating. This concerns early modern defenses of direct realism. It is well known that Arnauld took ideas to be acts in the human mind. On his view, acts contain things with "objective reality" and are therefore immediately directed at them. But how is this containment thesis to be understood? Adriaenssen offers a compelling interpretation by pointing out that Arnauld, following Descartes, invoked a principle of double instantiation: a thing can be instantiated both in the external world and in the mind. Thus, the sun can be instantiated both in the heavens and in the mind of someone who is thinking about the sun. It then exists with "formal reality" in the heavens and with "objective reality" in an act of the thinker. This is exactly the idea we already find in Aquinas, who claimed that all things can have a double instantiation. One might therefore think that Arnauld simply revived an old scholastic idea and used it to defend direct realism. But Adriaenssen makes clear that things are not so simple. For Aquinas, there can be a double instantiation because the form of a thing can be present both outside and inside the mind. Arnauld clearly rejected hylomorphism and denied that there are any forms. On his view, the material and the mental world have nothing in common. Consequently, he was not able to provide a metaphysical foundation for the principle of double instantiation, although he repeatedly invoked this principle. Adriaenssen dryly remarks that Arnauld "blocks all paths to the identity theory that, at the same time, he is flirting with" (p. 166). This is an important remark. It shows that the rejection of hylomorphism made a scholastic defense of direct realism impossible, despite the fact that some early modern authors paid lip service to this defense. Moreover, it makes clear that, in analyzing early modern accounts of direct realism, we should examine not only the cognitive theories on offer, but also the underlying metaphysical frameworks.

Let me add a third point that is innovative in Adriaenssen's study. The problem of the criterion is often taken to be decisive in epistemological debates. In early-modern terms, this problem can be formulated as follows: given that we need an internal representation in order to cognize an external thing, how can we ever tell whether or not our representation is trustworthy? No doubt, this problem was at the forefront of many early modern debates, for many Cartesian authors asked how we can ever tell whether or not our ideas are clear and distinct, and therefore trustworthy. Given the importance of this problem, it is tempting to think that scholastic authors also worried about it. But we should resist this temptation, as Adriaenssen rightly points out. Proponents of the species theory did not ask how we could ever tell whether or not our species are trustworthy. Why not? The main reason has to do with the "epistemological optimism" (p. 241) that was shared by all scholastic Aristotelians. Aquinas, Henry of Ghent and many other authors did not question that we have reliable cognitive capacities that, in principle, produce reliable cognitive acts. Of course, they acknowledged that there can be cases of misperception or illusion, but they considered them to be exceptional cases that need to be assessed against the background of veridical cases. Consequently, they saw no need to find a criterion that would enable us to test each and every cognitive act.

This changed with Descartes, who raised and took seriously the hypothesis that each and every act could be deceptive. Given this hypothesis, the problem of the criterion became a pressing problem. Adriaenssen points out this crucial difference and thereby shows that it would be misleading to think that medieval and early modern philosophers struggled with the same problem here. The problem makes no sense within the framework of an Aristotelian theory of capacities. Of course, it would be interesting to know why and how this theory was attacked and eventually rejected. Adriaenssen simply hints at the importance of this rejection without offering a detailed analysis.[1] But he is certainly right in pointing out that the problem of the criterion should not be considered a context-independent problem. It only makes sense when the reliability of cognitive capacities is no longer taken for granted.

In offering new interpretations, this study also gives rise to new questions. Let me mention just one of them. When discussing various critics of the species theory, Adriaenssen repeatedly points out that they all took species to be superfluous because they all thought that intellectual acts could be similitudes of external things. But what are similitudes? Adriaenssen explains them in terms of an inner structure. When presenting Olivi's theory, he writes that "cognitive states become structural or configurational similitudes of objects" (p. 69), and when analyzing Ockham's theory he speaks about "an account in terms of acts and their structural properties" (p. 119). This means, for example, that my act of thinking about the sun has a special inner structure that makes it different from my act of thinking about the moon or any other object. And given this structure, it is about the sun and nothing else. But what does it mean for an act to have an inner structure? Adriaenssen answers this question by drawing a parallel to written diagrams: as diagrams have an inner structure because of the special arrangement of their parts, so acts also have a structure because of a special configuration or arrangement (p. 69). But what exactly is configured or arranged in the case of acts? For Aristotelians, acts of the intellect have no material parts; they are immaterial entities. Moreover, they are simple entities, because they are non-compounded accidents of the intellect. Ockham clearly says that an act of intuitive cognition is an "incomplexum," i.e. an entity in the intellect that has no components or parts.[2] How can such an entity have an inner structure? There is a striking dissimilarity between a written diagram and an intellectual act: a diagram has parts that can be arranged or configured in a certain way, whereas an act lacks parts. So how can an act have an inner configuration?

As long as this question is not answered, the entire talk about "structural or configurational similitudes" remains puzzling. Admittedly, this is more of a problem for Ockham and other medieval authors than for Adriaenssen, for it shows that there is a certain tension in their accounts of acts. On the one hand, they want to make them metaphysically as simple as possible, on the other they want them to have an inner structure. But one cannot have the cake and eat it -- simplicity rules out inner structure. It is therefore not surprising that the species theory, which introduced a representational entity in addition to the act, did not die out after Ockham's critique. Supporters of this theory realized that one needs something in addition to a simple act for the cognition of a specific object. This additional entity does not prevent the act from being directed at the object; it rather makes its directedness possible. It would be worth looking more closely at the way metaphysical problems involved with Ockham's theory of simple acts motivated later authors to defend the necessity of species.

Adriaenssen's rich and detailed study, which carefully evaluates the extant literature (in English, German, French and Italian) and offers subtle interpretations of difficult texts, makes a real contribution to the research on medieval and early modern theories of cognition. It will be indispensable reading for students and scholars working on this topic.

[1] For a recent analysis, see S. Schmid, "Faculties in Early Modern Philosophy," in: The Faculties: A History, ed. D. Perler, Oxford University Press 2015, 150-197.

[2] Ockham, Ordinatio I, prologus, q. 1, Opera theologica I, St. Bonaventure: The Franciscan Institute 1967, 21 and 30.