Republicanism and Political Theory

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Cécile Laborde and John Maynor (eds.), Republicanism and Political Theory, Blackwell, 2008, 280pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405155809.

Reviewed by Hans Oberdiek, Swarthmore College


Republicanism is the old/new kid on the political theory block. It is as old as Aristotle, Cicero, Machiavelli, Milton, Harrington, Montesquieu, Rousseau, Madison and Adams -- and yet as new as the revival spearheaded by the intellectual historian Quentin Skinner and the philosopher Philip Pettit. We need to distinguish "old" and "new" republicanism partly because liberalism largely displaced it in the 19th and 20th centuries in Anglophone nations and partly because contemporary republicanism is liberal in that it accepts moral individualism, value pluralism, and an instrumental view of political life. There are two strands of old republicanism: one represented by Aristotle's concern for the good life to be realized in and through participation in self-governing communities, the other a neo-Roman tradition that emphasizes freedom (or independence) from the arbitrary will of an "alien power" under the rule of law. If Michael Sandel and Charles Taylor represent contemporary neo-Athenian interpretations of republicanism, Skinner and Pettit represent neo-Roman contemporary interpretations. This splendid anthology of ten original essays concentrates solely on the latter, with special emphasis on the thought of Skinner and Pettit.

In his famous 1958 inaugural address, "Two Concepts of Liberty," Isaiah Berlin identified two distinguishable concepts of liberty; republicanism, Skinner and Pettit think, offers us a third -- and better understanding. Republicanism, in their eyes, does not lie on a continuum between liberty as non-interference and self-mastery, but as an independent account, both conceptually and normatively. Liberty, as they conceive it, consists in non-domination, not non-interference, under the rule of law, and has nothing to do with individual self-mastery. American revolutionaries, for example, sought independence from Britain: they wanted to be free not only from the actuality and the probability but also and essentially the very possibility of domination by the British. They wished to live under laws of their own making and a government of their own devising. What they rightly resented, according to republican thought, was living under arbitrary alien power; power, that is, that not only lies in alien hands, but also that can be exercised completely at their discretion or prerogative. It would be neither here nor there, according to Skinner and Pettit, had the British been utterly benign rulers so long as they could have, at will, exercised power over the colonies. To live in such a state is tantamount to living in slavery. Slaves, after all, can live under a benign master, but that doesn't make them free, for it is the sole prerogative of owners to change their minds. One might be fortunate to live under a kind master, but that would not enough to make one free.

The anthology includes major defenders and critics of contemporary republicanism. Each essay breaks new conceptual and normative ground in the ongoing development and criticism of republicanism. Because the editors have provided a superb introductory chapter summarizing republicanism as well as the central claims in each essay and because many essays describe the principal features of republicanism, the book can be read on its own without reading the seminal books, pro and con, that engage with the theory. Most, though not all, of the critics are friendly, suggesting ways in which republicanism could be developed in ways that might meet their objections.

Pettit's republicanism consists of two theses. The first, as already noted, is that there can be unfreedom without actual interference. The bare possibility of interference is enough. To this Pettit adds a second thesis: interference as such need not compromise freedom. Interference isn't domination when it isn't arbitrary, and it isn't arbitrary provided it tracks our "avowed interests."[1] This is typically assured by living in a political community governed by the rule of law. So a state can levy taxes, impose coercive laws, and even imprison without diminishing one's freedom. Provided that the state seeks ends and employs means derived from the common, recognizable interests of its citizens, the most that can be said is that citizens are nonfree if, say, they are imprisoned for violating just laws, not that they are unfree. Skinner accepts the first thesis, but not the second. Both theses have their critics.

Matthew Kramer and Ian Carter separately defend a strong version of Berlin's first concept of liberty as noninterference. Calling it "pure negative freedom," they hold that it is the conceptually correct account of freedom as an "exercise concept." Freedom, Carter says, pertains to "doors that are open rather than about which doors one goes through or how one goes through them" (62). Carter thinks that Pettit rejects this account because he (like Hobbes) thinks political freedom must be continuous with a theory of freedom of the will; Carter disagrees. Both Kramer and Carter argue that Pettit fails to distinguish between acting voluntarily -- i.e., cases in which one's act is one's own, under the control of one's will -- and acting freely. Citing Serena Olsaretti, Carter claims that I do x unfreely if the reason I do x is that I have no acceptable alternative. Hobbes's highwayman offers us a voluntary choice, then, but not a free choice. Accepting liberty as "pure negative freedom," therefore, doesn't prevent us from making other judgments as to the limits on one's ability to act freely. And both Kramer and Carter think it is this latter notion that is salient in political theory, not the former. If we make that distinction, they argue, we can absorb freedom as domination, for dominators do not provide those dominated with acceptable alternatives. An account of negative freedom can thus accommodate the fundamental republican insight -- provided that domination isn't understood as mere possibility of interference. There must, Kramer insists, be some probability that the dominator will dominate. And in virtually any interesting case this will be so (especially if we include, as Skinner does, groveling and other forms of obsequiousness). Kramer and Carter agree that such a person acts voluntarily, but unfreely: he has no acceptable alternative but to grovel and show deference. In the final essay, Marilyn Friedman urges republicans to limit the criterion of domination even more narrowly " … to cases of actual or attempted arbitrary interference" (252). Mere possibility of domination -- and, by extension, probability of domination -- condemns too many legitimate relationships, according to her.

Pettit's second thesis -- that not all interventions limit freedom -- also finds critics. Obstacles are restrictions, according to Pettit, only if they don't track your avowed interests. This is so if the laws governing a person are just and self-imposed through a liberal, democratic and constitutional process with judicial review. This, Carter argues, moralizes the conception of freedom: Pettit seems to think obstacles don't restrict freedom provided that they are morally legitimate, such as justly imposed taxes or prison sentences. Neither Kramer nor Carter thinks this second thesis survives scrutiny.

Skinner and Pettit respond vigorously to these criticisms, especially the first. Skinner argues that Kramer and Carter misunderstand the existential condition of slavery -- which could be benign -- with the predicament of slaves "once they begin to reflect on their servitude." Thus, the American colonists, once they reflected on the fact that their British master's power is arbitrary in the sense that it is always open to him to govern them, "with impunity, according to his mere arbitrium, his own will, and desires" (86). Rhetorically, this has great force. I find it strained, however, not to draw a rather sharp distinction between the grievances of the American colonists against foreign domination by the British from those Africans that Southern colonists themselves bought and sold as slaves.

Pettit makes a spirited defense of his two theses and, in doing so, adds immeasurably to our understanding of "pure negative liberty" and his own "freedom as non-domination." On the former view, interference means removing an option, and this would constitute an infringement of the only freedom that is authentic. So the groveling slave is interfered with just because the option of looking the benign dominator in the eye isn't available. But Pettit argues that it isn't only that options are removed, but that they are replaced. Pettit thinks that the way Kramer and Carter, following Hillel Steiner, individuate options is too coarse. Instead, "if an option is changed in a way that engages your values -- whether or not these are the right values, by some independent metric -- then it is thereby made into a different option" (121). So in one fell swoop, Pettit rebuts the charge that his notion of freedom is "moralized" -- your values, right or wrong -- and is both more comprehensive and parsimonious than pure negative liberty. I remain unconvinced, and follow Henry Richardson (not represented but referenced here), who claims that "Pettit's concept of non-arbitrariness is compatible with liberal understandings of the common good, founded on basic ideals of equality and respect for individuals" (9).[2]

The exchange among Kramer, Carter, Skinner, and Pettit takes up about half the book and significantly pushes our understanding of the issues dividing liberals from republicans, both conceptually and normatively. The question is how much republicanism can be absorbed by liberalism -- or whether deep differences remain. When liberalism is married with constitutional democracy and the rule of law, as it invariably is today, it might be that, in the end, civic republicanism reminds liberals that domination with the probability of interference is something that they too long ignored.

Contemporary republicans stress the essential importance of democracy and citizenship. According to Pettit, democracy need not be participatory, as some civic humanists argue, but editorial. That is, through an elaborate system of checks and balances, regular elections, and "invigilating" those in power, we can "vote the rascals out" -- and let a new lot govern us. The important thing -- in keeping with freedom as non-domination -- is that we are citizens, not subjects. Citizens can look one another in the eye; subjects must act deferentially. The distinction is one of substance, not names, so Englishmen are called subjects of the Crown, but for all intents and purposes they are citizens in every important sense.

David Miller, who sympathizes with republicanism, questions whether it is realistic to think that the European Union might one day become a republic. Doubts are engendered not primarily by size -- the United States would seem to meet Skinner's and Pettit's criteria -- but by language and culture. Europe, Miller worries, is too culturally diverse in all respects to form "a people." Further, the labyrinthine political structure of the European Union is opaque to almost everyone. Instead of checks and balances, EU institutions are Byzantine with a stunning lack of transparency. Consequently, "factions" appear all but inevitable. And this violates

a principle common to all republicans … : social divisions within the political community are harmful to republican values in so far as they give rise to factions, allegiance to which displaces allegiance to the political community as a whole. Successful republics need not be homogenous … so long as these differences do not consolidate into rival factions (139).

Not only does complexity make for opacity, but also, he contends, the EU is closer to an oligarchy than a democracy. Further, its emphasis on and proliferation of rights makes it more liberal than republican. Miller lays down two challenges if the EU is to become a republic: motivational and institutional. Motivationally, what can substitute for "civic virtue" to provide solidarity? Institutionally, how can self-rule be realized in large, complex, and culturally diverse nations? Miller connects republicanism and nationality. This has three aspects. First, nations are large-scale communities tied together by a common history, language, and culture. Second, within such communities, members acknowledge duties of mutual aid. And third, they trust one another more than they do outsiders. Those who think that the EU could become a republic argue that it is enough if members are committed to a constitution, rule of law, and other practices of high democracies. Miller remains skeptical arguing that the cement of nationality is needed. Habermas, for example, is well known for suggesting that "constitutional patriotism" can suffice. This, Miller argues, is far too abstract to unite more than a few cosmopolitans. The question, he concludes, boils down to this:

Can there be a republic without active citizens committed to pursuing the public good … ? And can there be active citizens without a political community held together by a sense of common belonging? Large conglomerates such as the EU are unsuited to republican politics not just because of their size, and the physical gap that separates the central institutions from most citizens, but because they are divided in such a way that citizens' primary loyalties are inevitably directed toward their compatriots. (155)

Critics might agree that the EU is not yet a republic, but would challenge the "inevitability" aspect of Miller's contention.

Richard Bellamy extends a vision of republicanism more radical than Pettit's and one that rejects Miller's worries about "factionalism" altogether. Bellamy rejects two common theses of contemporary republicanism: the need for a written constitution and the need for the judiciary to protect it. Democracy, he argues, cannot guarantee outputs that promote the public or common good, but it just might be able to provide stable and fair inputs so that citizens can live with the results. This is a process-based view of democracy: "For, though we cannot identify whether outcomes are non-arbitrary with certainty, we can have a non-arbitrary process for their selection and contestation" (167). If all citizens are equal and each person has a vote, then democracy is non-dominating. Or at least it is if citizens are prepared to acknowledge that equal concern and respect are owed each other. It is Pettit's view that right-based judicial review coupled with contestatory democracy will help insure that "common recognizable interests" are satisfied. But Bellamy counters, first, that Pettit owes us an account of "common recognizable interests" (and not just "avowed interests"), but also why a constitutional court is the best way of insuring this. Bellamy opposes judicial review for reasons explored elsewhere by Jeremy Waldron. At bottom, what is wrong with Pettit -- and Rawls and Habermas, for that matter -- is that each substitutes an idealized apolitical democratic process for "actual existing democracy." Ballamy thus supports a "… normative case for a thorough-going democratic proceduralism that goes all the way down" (175). So unlike Miller, Bellamy accepts "factionalism" as a normal part of rough and tumble democratic politics. Constitutional change comes about primarily through shifting political majorities. Of course, if winners are not prepared to become losers -- i.e., if they are unwilling to reciprocate and treat fellow citizens with equal respect -- then democracy will fail. But republicanism won't save it from that fate.

As a friend of republicanism, James Bohman nonetheless disagrees with Pettit, Skinner, and Miller, as well as with advocates of liberal rights. His purpose, he says, is to develop a republican form of cosmopolitanism. If we think of contemporary republicanism as inexorably linked to democracy, then we have the basis, he argues, to establish "the obligation to form a republic of humanity, insofar as just such a political community is required in order to realize nondomination" (190). For, after all, it is little comfort if one democratic republic (say the United States) can effectively dominate nonrepublican and technologically less developed communities. Given his argument, he might well have added other weaker republican communities, too. In the era of globalization "new principal/agent relations have created new forms of unaccountable authority as extensions of state authority" (191). Skinner and Pettit are faulted for elitism because they don't fully recognize that the anti-colonialist movement was also a move against neo-Roman republicanism and its nationalism: empires along with monarchies must be rejected as antiquated. In its stead we must establish a distinctly normative conception according to which nondomination is secure only if one's normative statuses and powers can't be arbitrarily changed. And that means not only the status of those in one nation, but transnationally. This is the contemporary challenge. Basic human rights -- transnational by nature -- provide those normative powers and status sufficient to secure nondomination. But isn't this just cosmopolitan liberalism? Not necessarily, for Bohman gives them "a republican political twist by conceiving them as elaborating the most basic membership status: membership in the human political community" (192). As contemporary republicans are committed to democracy, this view further entails the normative power of anyone anywhere to initiate deliberation that is the basis of common liberty and nondomination. Bohman thus directly confronts Miller as well as Skinner and Pettit. For if Bohman is correct, there is no reason that the EU couldn't be a republic: it would just be a transnational one. Bohman would also seem to be at odds with Bellamy, because his account of democracy is far more substantive than procedural.

In developing his argument Bohman highlights weaknesses in contemporary republicanism. In particular, Bohman makes a good case -- again following Henry Richardson -- that domination and nondomination are inherently normative notions. For what counts as "arbitrary" makes sense only against a normative background of "rights, duties, roles, and institutions" (198). Further, Pettit's emphasis on the will leaves out -- something Kramer and Carter also point out -- the essential normative power of citizenship, namely: "the positive and creative power to interpret, shape and reform those very normative powers possessed by agents who seek to impose obligations and duties on others without allowing themselves to be addressed by others" (199). What citizenship demands is communicative freedom, or the normative power to transform existing norms to establish and give content to mutual obligations through joint deliberation. He concludes that "freedom as nondomination can best be realized in a highly differentiated, decentered polity with a commitment to common liberty" (210). In particular, the republic of humanity -- a normative, not a descriptive concept -- makes rights central: "membership in humanity, understood [following Hannah Arendt] as the right to have rights, is thus the most basic of human freedoms" (210). While a philosophical stretch, Bohman's idealized account of transnational republicanism suggests just how far republicanism might be pushed. One might wonder, however, whether even cosmopolitan liberals, with their emphasis on basic human rights, are prepared to suggest that there could be a transnational democracy of humanity. They would, I believe, think that a leap too far.

Pettit is a consequentialist as well as a republican. As he believes that republicanism is a complete and unitary theory, it isn't surprising that he (along with co-author John Braithwaite) develops a republican defense of punishment along consequentialist lines. This is a tall order. Many have despaired at providing a unitary account of the grounds of punishment at all, let alone connecting it so directly to a political theory, especially one as lean as Pettit's. Richard Dagger provides a succinct account of the Braithwaite-Pettit account and offers a republican retributivist account in its stead. According to the former, republicans must prevent crime and punish criminals in order to promote dominion by minimizing predations of others. Dagger usefully reminds us that republican freedom is a negative form of liberty. Its motto might well be "Don't Tread on Me," where "me" can be an individual as well as a community. Dominion, according to Braithwaite and Pettit, is comparative in that every citizen should enjoy the same degree of liberty. (Equal liberty, of course, is also an essential tenet of liberalism, so isn't peculiar to republicanism.) Crime is therefore, according to republicanism, an assault on one's equal standing as a citizen. Yet this defense of criminal law won't allow us to use any method that would deter crime or punish criminals, for the republican approach, though consequentialist, isn't utilitarian. Promoting dominion is limited by a distributive element that would be violated, for instance, by punishing the innocent.

Despite this proviso, Dagger insists that Braithwaite's and Pettit's forward-looking republicanism has a "crippling defect": "the attempt to maximize dominion will not do justice to the backward-looking considerations of guilt, innocence, or the severity of the offense" (227). In a later article, Pettit tries to meet this criticism (and others) by emphasizing the prominence of rectification. As Dagger notes, "rectification" does not slip easily from the lips of most consequentialist theories of punishment. Petitt tries to transform this backward-looking consideration into a forward-looking one by arguing that rectification means that the miscreant should "pay up," not that he should be "paid back." This brings us to the three "Rs" of republican punishment: recognition, recompense, and reassurance. Dagger argues, however, that R. A. Duff's communicative retributivism can capture these three "Rs" at least as well as Pettit's republican consequentialism. As Duff puts it in Punishment, Communication, and Community (2001), "punishment should be understood as a species of secular penance that aims not just to communicate censure but thereby to persuade offenders to repentance, self-reform, and reconciliation" (xvii-xix). Duff argues that this is a retributivist theory, that he values autonomy instead of dominion, and that he regards his theory as "liberal-communitarian," not republican. There is more in this valuable essay, but as it concentrates as much on Duff's views as Pettit's, I will say no more about it.

This brings us to the final essay: Marilyn Friedman's judicious feminist response to Pettit's republicanism. This is a fitting conclusion to the collection. Not only does it recapitulate the central theses of republicanism, but develops several telling objections. Pettit sees dependency as a vice, both at the level of politics and interpersonal relations, so he has much to say about the ways in which many men dominate many women. Friedman praises this, but wishes to emphasize that dependency is not always a vice. Indeed, it is inevitable: all children are dependent on adults, and, sadly, most people will become dependent on caregivers in their final years:

There is nothing to scorn in dependency. What is needed instead is a proper appreciation of how to manage the interdependencies of human relationships in ways that benefit all participants while minimizing the arbitrary interferences and abuses that dependency may permit to happen. (255)

An excess of power relative to another is sometimes absolutely necessary if people are to meet the needs of others.

Friedman's insight leads her to raise more general concerns about Pettit's notions of domination and arbitrariness. She finds them both too broad and too narrow, and in desperate need of articulating background normative conditions -- a criticism, as we have seen, others register as well. Recall, for instance, that the mere possibility of domination is enough to make a relationship arbitrary. But then, she argues, most men must stand justly charged with domination even if they are models of what women seek in men! More generally, an ideal of nondomination that rules out unused capacities for arbitrary domination is far too demanding, and could only be realized in a totalitarian state. Yet Pettit's account is also too narrow if we emphasize lacking regard for the interests of others. Men's protective and breadwinning activities often take into account the needs of women, and millions of women have no alternative but to accept this help and many have sought it. At the same time, in many, though not by any means all, cases this help has been integral to a relationship that, overall, is marked by domination. The man "brings home the bacon" and "the little woman" becomes his servant. In short, We must, Friedman argues, look at relationships, in their entirety. Petitt too often, she thinks, concentrates on individual acts, which disregards the relationship.

Finally, Friedman draws attention to an ambiguity running throughout Pettit's writings. As we have seen, Pettit holds that interference is arbitrary when it is chosen without reference to the interests or the opinions of those affected. In other places, however, Pettit speaks of avowed interests and sometimes he says that interference is arbitrary if it doesn't track relevant interests. Friedman lays out three alternatives Pettit might have in mind for when interference constitutes domination: (1) ignores both interests and opinions/ideas; (2) ignores either, but not both; (3) ignores one's avowed interests. Although (3) is an instance of (2), Friedman singles it out as the best account of domination. If a dominant party harms someone's interests but doesn't ignore one's perspective, then, she contends, we should say that the person was injured rather than dominated. To injure someone, of course, can be even more serious than dominating someone. Her point is that they need to be distinguished. Yet Friedman realizes that (3) only works if we provide exceptions for those in conditions of dependency: e.g., young children, those who suffer dementia or are psychologically traumatized. These exceptions, in turn, must meet two conditions.

First, the interference must be aimed at the well-being of the recipient in some important respect … . Second, the interference should be carried out with expressions of clear concern for the recipient's well-being … . These respectful forms of intervention, though they run contrary to the judgment of the recipient, do not constitute domination. Instead, they constitute paternalism -- or parentalism. (264)

This is all eminently sensible, but it makes clear that Pettit's notion of republican domination must either be "moralized" or certain background evaluative and normative conditions must be firmly in place for the general account to be appealing. Finally, returning to the theme of women and domination, Friedman argues that while we should attend to patterns of male domination, she argues that we must define the arbitrariness of dominating interference in individual terms. For women (and, she might have added, minorities) have complex identities that cannot be captured by applying the notion of domination to general reference classes. We should no more "homogenize" women than any other group. This raises the question, which Friedman does not, whether the core cases of domination Skinner and Pettit use don't also fall afoul of this criticism. A sizeable number of American colonialists, after all, did not seek independence from the British. They certainly thought that their "avowed interests" were satisfactorily met. What Friedman shows is how complex and indeterminate domination can be. At the same time, her suggestions -- like so many in the book -- are designed to strengthen Pettit's civic republican idea of freedom, not undermine it.

This splendid anthology not only advances arguments in and about republicanism, but also encourages the reader to go back to the founding texts, both classic and contemporary. Fortunately, the editors and each author provide excellent bibliographies. The collection deserves a wide readership among political theorists, philosophers, and historians.


Arendt, H., 2000, "What is Freedom?" in Behr, P., editor, The Portable Arendt, pp. 438-62, New York: Putnam.

Berlin, I., 1969, "Two Concepts of Liberty." in Berlin, I., Four Essays on Liberty, London: Oxford University Press.

Braithwaite, J. & Pettit, P., 1990, Not Just Deserts: A Republican Theory of Criminal Punishment, Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Braithwaite, J. & Pettit, P., 1993-4, "The Three Rs of Republican Sentencing," Current Issues in Criminal Justice, 5, 318-25.

Duff, R. A., 2001, Punishment, Communication, and Community, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Habermas, J., 1996, Between Facts and Norms: Contributions to a Discourse Theory of Law and Democracy, Cambridge: Polity Press.

Olsaretti, S., 2004, Liberty, Desert and the Market, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Pettit, P., 1997, Republicanism: A Theory of Freedom and Government, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Pettit, P., 1997, "Republican Theory and Criminal Punishment," Utilitas, 9, 59-79.

Pettit, P., 2000, "Democracy, Electoral and Contestatory, in Shapiro, I. & Macedo, S., editors, Designing Democratic Institutions, pp. 105-47, New York: New York University Press.

Rawls, J., 1971, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, MA: Cambridge University Press.

Richardson, H., 2002, Democratic Autonomy: Public Reasoning about the Ends of Policy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Sandel, M. 1996, Democracy's Discontent: America in Search of a Public Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Oxford University Press.

Skinner, Q., 1997, Liberty before Liberalism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Skinner, Q., 2002, "A Third Concept of Liberty," Proceedings of the British Academy, 117, 237-68.

Steiner, H., 1994, An Essay on Rights, Oxford: Blackwell.

Taylor, C., 1995, "Cross Purposes: The Liberal-Communitarian Debate," in Taylor, C., Philosophical Arguments, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

[1] In the last essay, Marilyn Friedman argues that Pettit's account vacillates between "avowed interests" and "real interests."

[2] The quotation is taken from the editors, not Richardson.