Responding to Global Poverty: Harm, Responsibility, and Agency

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Christian Barry and Gerhard Øverland, Responding to Global Poverty: Harm, Responsibility, and Agency, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 263pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107031470.

Reviewed by George Pavlakos, University of Glasgow


Facts of (global) poverty ground responsibility whereby people owe to one another obligations of justice. Recent controversies about the nature of our relation with those who live beyond the borders of our countries have disabled this compelling and, in many ways, robust explanation, leaving many a philosopher struggling to establish a much lower baseline for the explanation of responsibility for global poverty. If there are no (normative) facts of justice, which can explain how facts of poverty ground responsibility, some other route needs to be taken.

A standard move is to divest the interaction between the poor and the affluent of any substantive normative meaning and try to work out grounds for the responsibility owed by the latter to the former. In this scenario affluent people are not unlike innocent bystanders who chance upon a life-threatening accident. Or, at most, they are like an innocent driver whose contribution to a probable accident cannot be attributed to negligence. In either of these cases the innocent agent will still bear responsibility when confronted with the facts of the situation, owing to some thin moral principle that requires all to bear some cost when they come across others in need of assistance. Similarly, affluent individuals, in their capacity as innocent bystanders or innocent contributors become responsible when confronted with facts of global poverty.

This is more or less the route Christian Barry and Gerhard Øverland take. The challenge they face (never mentioned explicitly) is to explain how and to what extent facts of poverty ground responsibility in the absence of relational duties of justice. All in all, they do a rather good job by offering a realistic assessment of the types of responsibility involved, cautioning against the great expectations of some philosophers (Peter Singer) and suggesting that others (Thomas Pogge) might be reading too much into the relation between the affluent and the poor, given disagreement about the existence of a global basic structure. What is less clear is whether the sober picture they paint should be interpreted as advising against the route they take or, instead, as indicating that the account they offer is our best (philosophical) shot against the problem of global poverty, given disagreement about global justice.

Roughly put their argument runs as follows. The stringency of the responsibility of innocent agents varies according to the degree of their involvement in the situations that generate poverty. Using the distinction between doing and allowing (supplemented by an original third category, that of enabling) the authors argue that innocent allowers incur less stringent responsibilities than innocent enablers and doers; and among the latter two the responsibility of doers is deemed in principle more stringent than that of enablers. In their account, doing and enabling represent different degrees of involvement in the causes of poverty, which are determined against a parameter of how agents give rise to cost. On the authors' definition an innocent agent can give rise to cost when his or her location, movements or agency result in someone's being  harmed (97). Of particular interest are cases of permissible risk-taking and freak accidents, such as the driving of a vehicle or the turn of a switch which starts a fire next door because of an antecedent electrical storm that has rewired the electrical circuit. Giving rise to cost in these and other similar cases affects the level of the required cost, i.e. the cost that (morally) ought to be shouldered by an agent to prevent another innocent person from suffering.

Contribution to the rise of the cost also helps the authors draw the distinction between allowing, doing and enabling (these ideas are developed mainly in Chapters 5 and 6). Here is a rough sketch of the complex account, which is developed across several chapters. Innocent bystanders do not give rise to cost because they merely allow harm to occur; as a result their responsibility is less stringent and can be discharged by shouldering a moderate amount of cost (this category comprises mainly duties of assistance). Conversely, those who contribute to the relevant harm give rise to cost, incurring a much more stringent responsibility. The focus of the argument is on non-culpable or innocent contributors. While negligent behavior would constitute an additional reason to allocate responsibility, the authors allow for a notion of responsibility that is grounded on innocent contribution to harm. Such innocent contributors are in a normative situation which is distinct from that of an innocent bystander in that, although being equally innocent, they must consider "whether to intervene at some cost to themselves to protect the person under threat of harm when they have made it the case that they or the prospective victim will be harmed in some measure. They cannot claim to be uninvolved in the creation of the situation." (103)

In effect, innocent contributors cannot appeal to a discount of cost when looking to discharge their responsibility (in other words, the cost that is morally required from them is substantial). Further, the authors draw a distinction among contributors who directly contribute to harm (doing) and those who merely enable harm by (non-culpably) neutralizing a preventer of harm (85-6). This further distinction between doing and enabling reflects differences in the cost involved in each case. In particular, cases of doing are deemed more 'costly' than those of enabling, because the rise of cost comes as a result of some relevant action and a complete casual process that links that action to the relevant harm. It is not entirely convincing that considerations of cost, as employed by the authors, can explain the tripartite distinction between allowing, doing and enabling since ultimately the calculation of cost is itself grounded on facts about the level of the causal involvement of agents.

Against this conceptual background, which I have reconstructed only tangentially, the authors turn to discuss two broad categories under which fall the moral responsibilities of the relatively affluent individuals in the developed world to address global poverty.

Chapters 2-4 discuss assistance-based responsibilities by engaging with arguments advanced by Singer. The novelty here is that, in disagreement with Singer, Barry and Øverland argue that responsibilities for global justice are not initially very stringent, but become much more stringent when the agents fail to discharge them. The reason is that initially assistance based responsibilities do not give rise to cost because the agent merely allows the harm to occur. In result, the required cost for the responsible agent is moderate. However, failure to discharge an assistance-based responsibility modifies the involvement of the agent in the production of harm so that the agent remains no longer a bystander (allowing) but becomes a contributor (doing or enabling) to the harm. Thus, when failing in their assistance-based duties, agents start giving rise to cost, which increases progressively with each successive failure to discharge the obligation.

Having explored the stringency of the responsibility of innocent bystanders the authors move on to investigate -- in Part II of the book (Chapters 5-8)[1] -- the responsibility of innocent persons who contribute to global poverty (contribution-based responsibilities). Of special interest is the critical discussion of Pogge's arguments, which occupy a central place in the literature on global poverty. Barry and Øverland challenge Pogge's thesis that the affluent are harming the poor through their contribution to sustaining unjust institutional structures. They object that Pogge's conception of contribution to harm is overly broad and attempt to demonstrate, against the background of their own analysis, that the relations between poor and affluent are better understood in terms of exploitation.

Here is a succinct reconstruction of their argument. Their enquiry focuses on the normative content of the responsibility that arises from the contribution of the affluent to an unjust scheme that harms the poor. First, they argue that it cannot be the very stringent responsibility arising from a straightforward case of doing harm. At the same time it is not mere responsibility to assist; for, in supporting an unjust scheme the affluent seem to contribute to harm through some action of theirs. Yet, a paradoxical situation arises: even though on Pogge's account an unjust scheme is worse than the failure to assist, it also true that an unjust scheme constitutes an instance of assistance, however partial or incomplete this might be. In other words, in the absence of the unjust scheme those suffering poverty would be worse off, which is not the case had the person who fails to assist been absent. The authors take this as an indication that the responsibility of the affluent in supporting an unjust scheme is less stringent than the responsibility to assist incurred by someone who allows harm. Accordingly, Barry and Øverland propose to understand the contribution of the affluent as a sui generis instance of enabling harm, which can be better understood as exploitation.

While exploitation is morally wrong in itself, it might not lead to stringent responsibilities to alleviate poverty. Presumably the reason is again that it does not give rise to cost: the poor are already in a terrible situation. Clearly, implementing a less than just institutional scheme (say, exploitative trade) does not actively increase the cost. Thus duties from exploitation turn out to be less stringent than even duties from allowing harm. One must assume that exploitation is a further category of contribution that grounds even less stringent duties than the enabling of harm. Having thinned down the contribution of the globally affluent to such a degree, the authors argue that at the end of the day, non-contributory duties of assistance might be the best way to explain how facts of poverty ground the responsibility of the affluent.

It seems to me that this reconstruction is wanting. First, Pogge's account is not about innocent contributors. Second, even if the relation between the affluent and the poor is characterised as exploitation, the stringency of the responsibility arising from it does not wane.

Why is Pogge's account not about innocent contributors? If affluent people are innocent contributors then the moral baseline for their responsibility is determined by the reasons they have to alleviate the harm caused by their positioning or actions toward others. But, arguably, the reasons that apply when affluent and poor are involved in a scheme of interaction are not primarily reasons of that kind. Rather, the salient reasons are those shared reasons that make it the case that all those involved each have an independent reason to partake in the scheme.[2] Arguably, Pogge appeals to this different, much more stringent, baseline with a view to showing that obligations of justice can be detected beyond the standard site of the basic structure of a nation state. Thus, it is a mistake to view the contribution to an unjust scheme as an improvement on the failure to assist and, in consequence, deem the duty to assist more stringent than the duty to uphold a just scheme. Rather, the duty to assist should be viewed, morally speaking, as a second best scenario for dealing with whatever is left out of the scope of the standard cases, where stringent reasons of justice apply.

Further, re-describing the relation between affluent and poor as one of exploitation does not compromise the moral baseline in the way the authors envisage. On the contrary, exploitation is what an interaction between agents amounts to when it does not succeed in becoming an exchange. Conversely, for it to become a successful exchange an interaction needs to be grounded on reasons which allow all to act on reasons they each have independently of one another's doings and sayings.[3] Contrary to what Barry and Øverland seem to assume, re-describing the relation between the affluent and the poor as exploitation sets the moral bar much higher, because it points in the direction of a common scheme of reasons that make it the case that all parties are acting on independent reasons. Such reasons are typically stringent reasons of justice.

Finally, in the third part (Chapters 9-11), Barry and Øverland turn to examine the implications of contribution-based responsibilities in light of the account of contribution that they've developed. The key idea here is that agents who incur stringent, contribution-based responsibilities forfeit their immunity and become subject to external imposition through the proportionate use of force. The authors review several factors that can affect blameworthiness, give rise to excuses, or increase uncertainty with respect to the degree of contribution to the harm. This discussion is repetitive in that it reiterates long portions of arguments that were presented earlier. At the same time, in trying to cover too much ground, the writing is somewhat breezy and the argument moves too quickly, and the authors end up failing to discuss in depth several of the important issues it raises. That said, given the vast range and complexity of the problem of global poverty, the authors succeed in showing that their account would generate a consistent interpretive scheme of conceptual tools for tackling the multiple parameters of the topic.

Although it will not strike the reader as breaking much new ground, the book is invaluable in bringing together often disconnected debates from the philosophy of action, global justice, the philosophy of law and practical ethics, helping the reader to comprehend the conceptual building blocks and moral structure of the pressing problem of global poverty. In their effort to offer a coherent conceptual framework, the authors appear at times as trying to fit the various strands of the debate into a single straightjacket. In conclusion, the book will repay careful reading by anyone interested in understanding the complexity of global poverty, in particular advanced undergraduate and graduate students of the social sciences and philosophy, as well as policy makers and those working in the field who are interested in a more sophisticated account.

[1] Oddly enough chapter 8 has been included in the third part of the book but, as its content suggests and the authors affirm in their introduction, it should have been included in the second part.

[2] See Julius, A. J. 2006. Nagel's Atlas. Philosophy & Public Affairs 34: 176-92.

[3] Julius, A. J. 2013a. The Possibility of Exchange. Politics, Philosophy & Economics 12: 361-74.