Rethinking Durkheim and His Tradition

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Warren Schmaus, Rethinking Durkheim and His Tradition, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 208pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521838169.

Reviewed by Terry Godlove, Hofstra University


This book is an extended examination of Emile Durkheim's claim that the most basic categories of thought are social in nature. It is a thorough treatment, ranging over such disciplines as the theory of knowledge, history and philosophy of science, sociology, Durkheim studies, French intellectual history, and cognitive science. Schmaus maintains a high level of analysis throughout -- an achievement all the more remarkable in view of the number of fields he has in view. My hesitations are few. The book will be of interest to many in the fields named above.

The body of the book aims to refocus an ongoing scholarly discussion about how to understand Durkheim's approach to categories, especially as articulated in The Elementary Forms of Religious Life (1912). Durkheim seems to be engaging Kant, with unhappy results. He says he wants to preserve the Kantian universality and necessity of the categories while at the same time improving on Kant's treatment by giving these two properties a real rather than what he sees as a pseudo explanation. To say they are "conditions of experience" is to make no real advance. Progress comes with the recognition that they are social products, required by and artifacts of social life. The trouble, as many people have pointed out over the years, is that this doesn't so much engage the Kantian problematic as it changes the subject. No doubt the rise of the field we now know as the sociology of knowledge shows the depth and power of Durkheim's line of investigation; but to the extent that he has given an empirical explanation of the categories, he erases the universality and necessity that Kant has in view. People like me have reacted with puzzlement. It's the sort of strategy -- change the subject and then declare victory -- that one finds in mediocre undergraduate papers.

For the first six of the book's seven chapters, Schmaus argues that our puzzlement comes from failing to appreciate the extent to which Durkheim was not directly engaging Kant at all. Instead, he was engaging a picture of Kant painted by academic philosophy in nineteenth-century France, chiefly by Victor Cousin (1792-1867), Pierre Maine de Biran (1766-1824), and Paul Janet (1823-1899). Schmaus urges that, once we appreciate the provenance and details of this picture, Durkheim will also come into better focus.

The main point turns out to be that Durkheim absorbed from Cousin, Maine de Biran, and Janet a badly distorted account of Kant's theory of knowledge and, in particular, of the categories. The crucial distortion was the claim that Kant had tried to give the categories a psychological rather than a transcendental grounding. In the Critique of Pure Reason (1781, 1787), Kant had assumed the objectivity of empirical judgment, and had tried to provide a regressive account of its necessary (a priori) conditions. Thus, he had looked to judgments of experience as the "clue" to the categories --to take Schmaus's example, "All whales are mammals" is universal, affirmative, categorical and assertoric (43). Kant's idea is that we rely on some set of these concepts when we make empirical judgments. This reliance is not that of innateness: these concepts make possible the investigation of any subject matter whatever, including that of innateness. As Schmaus presents them, Cousin, Biran and Janet completely miss this regressive strategy and so run together "a priori" and "innate." Janet, for example, says that Kant regarded the categories as "innate psychological capacities" (89). Schmaus sums up:

In light of the problems with … French academic philosophy, Durkheim's attempt to derive the categories from social causes makes a kind of sense. Where Janet and others made the conscience the source of the categories, Durkheim instead turned to the conscience collective (95).

Schmaus makes a persuasive case. Whereas there is little evidence that Durkheim studied Kant's work directly (99), we know he read and taught from Janet's textbook on a daily basis. The move from conscience to conscience collective is certainly a natural one. Durkheim's thesis does, indeed, make a kind of sense.

One side effect of Schmaus's story is that nineteenth-century French academic philosophy comes off as a decidedly mixed bag. This historical material is one the book's strengths -- Schmaus has done a great service in bringing it to light. But his fine, detailed exposition makes the uneven quality of the material all too apparent. The author walks a fine line. On the one hand, he wants to say that, given what Durkheim was told about Kant, it was quite reasonable for Durkheim to think (wrongly) that his sociological approach truly engaged Kant's problematic. On the other hand, what Cousin, Maine de Biran and Janet told him seems to have been pretty uniformly awful. Thus, Cousin's considered view is that, "people have a need for fixed, immutable principles" (62). Maine de Biran "regarded apperception as a special intellectual faculty that reveals the self as noumenal object" (70); this turns Kant on his head, but, then, as Schmaus tell us, Maine de Biran never even read Kant! Janet protests that Kant has left God off his list of categories (80) -- an odd complaint, considering that one of the main negative thrusts of the Critique is that the concept of God can have no legitimate theoretical application. And Durkheim himself doesn't get entirely off the hook: never having studied Hume or Kant he yet proclaims confidently that "the mind finds itself unable to conceive a phenomenon without assuming some other phenomenon that is a condition of the first and calls these phenomena 'cause' and 'effect' (113). Schmaus's intellectual history does its intended work -- it explains why Durkheim wrongly thought his sociological theory of the categories engaged Kant's problematic -- but it threatens to substitute one sort of puzzlement for another.

Explanation is not exculpation, and at times Schmaus seems to want both. Commenting on Durkheim's forebears' "psychologistic" interpretation of Kant, according to which the Critique "presents a psychological theory of how sensations are processed rather than an epistemological theory of the necessary conditions for … knowledge," Schmaus writes, "Although there are professional philosophers today who would regard this psychological reading of Kant as mistaken, it was highly influential at the time" (56). In this same spirit he later reminds us that "Kant is notoriously difficult to understand" (100). In passages such as these Schmaus seems to be trying to work up some sympathy for Durkheim's understanding of Kant's theory of knowledge.

Whether one finds these attempts at exculpation successful will depend on what one makes of the errors of Cousin, Maine de Biran and Janet and of Durkheim's culpability in unreflectively absorbing them. Of course Kant is difficult, and of course Kant has been interpreted very differently at different times. Karl Ameriks has recently given vivid expression to these issues. He argues that, in our own time, the analytic commitments of such eminent philosophers as Strawson, Sellars and Bennett prevented them from seeing the regressive strategy at the heart of Kant's Critical project.[1] Do we blame their talented graduate students and faithful readers for inheriting their interpretive commitments? If not, then how can we take Durkheim to task for endorsing the flawed picture he received? There is probably little one can do to settle such questions. The interpretive errors made by Cousin, Maine de Biran, Janet and Durkheim strike me as too basic and too careless -- again, several of them didn't even read the primary sources! -- to support Schmaus's apparent efforts at exculpation. They may strike others differently. At the same time, Schmaus's own portrayal in chapter two of Kant's theory of categories as necessary conditions of experience is first-rate. It is an excellent short introduction to Kant,[2] and could certainly orient the reader with little background in Kant-studies to what is at stake in the larger discussion. That Schmaus could fit it into so small a space is a large achievement. Ironically, it serves to distance the author from what are by his own standards the deeply flawed presentations of his 19th century authors.

One often has the thought that few others could have the breadth of training and expertise needed to write this book. For example, at one point Schmaus is commenting on Janet's complaint that, even if Kant is able to justify such very general synthetic a priori principles as the causal law, he is unable to justify particular laws. Schmaus recurs right away to Michael Friedman's contemporary claim that special laws should be regarded as instances of the general principle (90). The result is a remarkable synthesis of Kant-studies, history of 19th century French philosophy and philosophy of science. Again, Schmaus picks up the persistent refusal of the French tradition to grant Kant his basic distinction between space and time as forms of intuition and the pure concepts of the understanding (for example, 39, 64, 83, 89). This refusal will be noted by those interested in the transmission of Kant's philosophy into the early 20th century. In a striking parallel, Friedman has argued that this refusal was common to such influential German interpreters as Cassirer, Heidegger and Carnap.[3]

Perhaps the author's most original philosophical contribution is his suggestion in chapter six that we distinguish between the categories and what he calls their "social functions" or "functional expressions." Schmaus claims this distinction enables us to embrace what for Durkheim were incompatible claims. That is, we can make the underlying categories universal and necessary while allowing variability to their social functions (122ff.). This is a strikingly original proposal, and will no doubt generate much discussion. I close with some thoughts about it.

The only example to which Schmaus gives extended attention is causation. He proposes that we view the feeling of moral obligation, which plausibly serves to bind individuals into a group, as the functional expression of the underlying category of necessary connection (134). Different societies require different functional expressions (totemic imitation rites, family dinners, etc.), but the underlying category remains invariant. An immediate question must be how, exactly, the purported functional expression is related to its category? Is it a causal relationship? Is it conceptual? One of resemblance? One problem is that Schmaus doesn't spell out the content of the pure category in any detail, but since Kant is to the fore throughout, I take it Schmaus would be comfortable with, "successive events connected according to a rule." Certainly, then, we can't spell out the connection in causal terms -- that would be to allow the category to somehow bring its functional expression (the feeling of moral obligation) into being. It would be magical. It is also hard to make out a purely conceptual connection. Here the difficulty is how to make an advance over the bare idea of events connected according to a rule. Even if we see the category "contained in" ("expressed in") the feeling of moral obligation, somehow we need to add the idea of resisting temptation (or something like it), since obligation without temptation has no point. But to the extent that we add something to the original category that it did not contain we no longer have a purely conceptual relation. What about resemblance? The abstractness of the pure category would seem to make this route equally unpromising. In what respect does the feeling of obligation resemble the pure category of causation? There is the basic disanalogy between feeling and concept to be overcome.

The same obstacles face other Kantian candidates. Suppose we take the pure intuition of space, the "form of outer sense" -- again neither causal nor con­ce­p­tual nor resemblance relations seem able to generate a functional expression. Space itself pretty clearly has no causal powers. And as undifferent­iated, it cannot be conceptually related to objects in space. In what could any resemblance consist? Space is not an object of experience, and so all material resemblances are ruled out from the start.

A fourth characterization of the relation between a category and its social expression would be that the former "makes possible" the latter. Schmaus several times seems to endorse this way of putting the matter (122, 131). Thus, I might say that my feeling that I must answer the lawyer's question honestly while I am under oath depends on the underlying idea that two events can be necessarily connected. Similarly, I can arrange tents alongside one another but only if I presuppose that each of them are locatable in the same space in which I find myself. But from Schmaus's point of view this strikes me as a dangerous way to put the matter, as it invites the Kantian thought -- indeed, it very nearly is the Kantian thought -- that the conditions of possible experience are at the same time conditions of objects of possible experience. If we then try to suggest, in a Durkheimian spirit, that social forces are shaping the whole package, we thereby remove the necessity and universality of the categories -- the very thing that motivated our interest in them. Perhaps there are other ways to spell out the relationship between a Kantian category and what we might want to call its functional or social expression. If so, then perhaps Schmaus's proposal offers us a way to preserve conceptual uniformity and social variability of a Durkheimian sort.