Rethinking Mill's Ethics: Character and Aesthetic Education

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Colin Heydt, Rethinking Mill's Ethics: Character and Aesthetic Education, Continuum Books, 2006, 165pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826486398.

Reviewed by Henry R. West, Macalester College


The promotional statement on the back of this book says,

Discussion of John Stuart Mill's ethics has been dominated by concern with right and wrong action as determined by the principle of utility.  His substantive ethical positions about the kinds of lives we should lead and the kinds of dispositions we should strive to develop have been of interest only incidentally …  Colin Heydt's book unearths the rich context of moral and socio-political debate that Mill did not have to make explicit to his Victorian readers, in order to enrich the philosophical analysis of his ethics and to show a famous and misunderstood moralist in a new light.

 I would quarrel with the description of Mill as misunderstood, but this is a fair description of the aim of the book.  There is nothing new about Mill as a utilitarian moralist; in fact there is almost no discussion of Mill's theory of morality, nor of his theory of rights and of justice.  Utilitarianism is hardly mentioned except in five pages of the Introduction.  The book is focused on Mill's theories of character development, and the book is rich in filling in the Victorian context in which Mill wrote.  The title of the book is thus somewhat misleading, for it does not rethink the whole of Mill's ethics.  But it is an important supplement for understanding Mill as an ethical theorist.  Mill planned to write a book on ethology, the science of character development.  This book is not a statement of Mill's ethology, for it does little to explain the cause-effect relations that such a science would include.  But the author has pulled together from many places strands of the importance of character development for Mill's overall ethical philosophy.

Mill is well known to have spoken of an "art of life," on which his theory of morality is founded.  In A System of Logic it is said to have three branches, morality, prudence or policy, and aesthetics: the right, the expedient, and the beautiful or noble.  Heydt's book is addressing the third of these branches.  He argues that aesthetic education, by which he interprets Mill to mean the cultivation of certain feelings and imagination, is important for the enjoyment of pleasures of higher quality, but it is also essential for the development of social feelings, making people more sympathetic and more sensitive to the rights and welfare of others.  As is well known, Mill distinguished the morality of an act from the motive of the act.  Acts in accord with the utilitarian rule of action are right acts, even if done from motives that are not admirable.  But Mill assumed that people with admirable motives are more likely to do right acts and refrain from wrong ones.  Thus the study of what Mill has to say about the development of feelings is related to the utilitarian goal of maximizing happiness.

Heydt claims that a stimulus for Mill's focus on aesthetic education was his concern about the tendency of industrialism and urbanization to homogenize culture and to alienate people from one another.  Another stimulus was his reaction to his own education, which focused so much on intellectual development that it ignored the development of emotions.  Mill concluded that a broader education was necessary for a sense of fulfillment in life.  And in his critique of his education, he came to the conclusion that a utilitarian should not focus exclusively on the ultimate goal of happiness but on other goals with happiness achieved as a by-product.  The overall theme of the book, then, is Mill's theories of aesthetics and aesthetic education, as broadly conceived.

Chapter 1 presents Mill's positions on art criticism, with an eye to the ethical relevance of his theories.  Mill's early theory, according to Heydt, was to give the highest place to poetry, for the most important function of art was to express the emotions of the artist.  The communication of feelings to a viewer or audience was considered secondary.  Heydt traces a change in Mill's aesthetic theory, influenced, Heydt thinks, by Mill's study of the aesthetics of John Ruskin.  Heydt reviews Ruskin's aesthetic theory at some length, drawing the conclusions that there is a central connection between beauty and perfection, and that the process of forming one's taste is a central task in the formation of one's soul.  Becoming a good person is inseparable from developing one's taste for beauty.  Heydt claims that Mill's later aesthetic views, although not sharing the metaphysical and theological components of Ruskin's theory, reflected these points.  For Mill, in this later theory, the experience of beauty takes us outside of ordinary life, connecting us to ideals, and the culture of the individual -- our ennoblement -- depends upon our rising above known reality.  Heydt ties these views in with Mill's conception of life as art.  Life is not something merely to be enjoyed, but is capable of different kinds of perfection.  This chapter is of interest in itself for an analysis of Mill's aesthetics and its relation to Ruskin, apart from the larger theme of the book, and it sets the tone for the connection that Heydt sees between aesthetics and development of character.  The connection is sometimes stretched. The final two chapters of the book, "Social and Political Dimensions of Aesthetic Education: Family, Marriage and Gender Relations" and "Social and Political Dimensions of Aesthetic Education: The Industrial Economy and the Workplace" are derived from Mill's Subjection of Women and discussions in Principles of Political Economy about the advantages of industrial cooperatives in contrast to the workplace as presently constituted.  In these works, Mill is condemning the inequality in the family between husband and wife and the opposition of interests, coupled with inequalities, in the workplace.  These institutional arrangements do shape character development; they can be schools for the development of sympathy and the virtues or for the development of selfishness and cruelty.  They may engender freedom and equality or something akin to slavery.  Stretching the notion of "aesthetic education" to provide an interpretation of the importance of these institutions seems to this reader to have little connection to the aesthetic theories of Chapter 1, in spite of Heydt's efforts to make that out.

The second chapter gives a synopsis of Bentham's institutional approach to reform, which was shared by Mill's father James Mill and by Bentham's critic Thomas MacCauley.  It also surveys the critics of utilitarianism, such as Thomas Carlyle, William Coleridge, and Charles Dickens.  Heydt describes Mill's reaction against Bentham's emphasis on "exterior" conditions for the development of virtuous dispositions, instead emphasizing the importance of "interior" culture.  Here Heydt also discusses the pleasures of sympathy, and the contrast between Mill's view and not only Bentham's, but also the Puritanism of Mill's generation.  The contrast with Bentham is fair, but it is important to recognize that Mill also recognized the importance of institutions, as the final two chapters of this book point out.

Chapter 3 is addressed to Mill's appraisal of the possibility of a Religion of Humanity.  Heydt emphases the importance of imagination in Mill's theory of how a religion of humanity could encourage caring for others without the mystery of supernatural religion.  This chapter shows closer ties to the claims of chapter one -- that Mill's conception of beauty and its appreciation, in his later aesthetics, is of ethical importance.  Mill says that the value of religion to the individual, as a source of personal satisfaction and of elevated feelings, is not to be disputed, and he hopes that the idealization of our earthly life, the higher cultivation of what it can ideally be made, not just that of the individual but that of the species, can exalt one's feelings and ennoble our conduct without any belief in unseen powers.  Heydt quotes sufficient passages to convince the reader that Mill's conception of a religion of humanity is closely akin to his conception of the powers of poetry and appreciation of beauty.

Throughout the book, there are illuminating contrasts between the views of Mill and Bentham.  There are also comparisons and contrasts between Mill and anti-utilitarian critics of the industrialism and urbanization of the age, such as Carlyle, Coleridge, Dickens, and others.  The book is rich is filling in the intellectual context in which Mill wrote.  The world was changing.  Some intellectuals wanted to return to a better, simpler past.  Mill was optimistic about the possibilities of the future.

The book grew out of a doctoral dissertation at Boston University.  Colin Heydt is assistant professor in philosophy at the University of South Florida.  Chapter 1, "The Ethics of Aesthetics and Life as Art" is revised from its original appearance in On Religion and Politics, ed. C. Lovett and P. Kernahan (Vienna: IWM, 2004).  An earlier version of Chapter 2, "Mill, Bentham, and 'Internal Culture'" appeared in the British Journal of the History of Philosophy, and an earlier version of Chapter 3, "Narrative, Imagination, and the Religion of Humanity in Mill's Ethics" was published in the Journal of the History of Philosophy.  The text is well-documented with end-notes to each chapter.  Rethinking Mill's Ethics is to be recommended to anyone interested in Mill's theories of character and aesthetic education and of the relationship of his and other intellectuals' reactions to the challenges of his time.