Rethinking the Individualism-Holism Debate: Essays in the Philosophy of Social Science

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Julie Zahle and Finn Collin (eds.), Rethinking the Individualism-Holism Debate: Essays in the Philosophy of Social Science, Springer, 2014, 255pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319053431.

Reviewed by Phillip Honenberger, Philadelphia Area Center for History of Science


Are social phenomena better explained in terms of the characteristics of individual human beings, or in terms of the characteristics of groups or collectives? Are all social-level entities and events identical to some set of individual-level entities and events, or are social-level entities and events ever "more than the sum" of their individual-level parts? Traditionally, those who opt for the first of these options are called "individualists," while those who opt for the second are called "holists." The present collection of essays by contemporary philosophers of social science provides a state-of-the-art introduction to recent moves in the long-standing debate between adherents of these positions, as well as recent thinking about related questions, such as the definition of and distinction between the individual and the social; the meaning and validity of the idea of higher and lower levels of composition; the understanding of individual agency, including discussion of rational choice and game theory, as well as new pragmatist and ecological models; whether and in what sense groups can be agents; and how explanation in the social sciences ought to be understood and evaluated. The volume includes essays both from veteran philosophers of social science (Daniel Little, Philip Pettit, Harold Kincaid, and Mark Risjord) and early and mid-career contributors to the field (Julie Zahle, Finn Collin, Brian Epstein, Dave Elder-Vass, András Szigeti, Petri Ylikoski, Jeroen Van Bouwel, Mathew McCubbins, and Mark Turner).

The modern holism-individualism debate has its origins in the formative development of modern social science itself, in the work (for instance) of G. W. F. Hegel, Karl Marx, Auguste Comte, and Herbert Spencer. The tension played out in an especially influential way in two widely publicized controversies: the debate between Émile Durkheim and Gabriel Tarde regarding "social facts," and F. A. Hayek's and Karl Popper's attacks on the "holism" of various mid-20th-century social science traditions (Lukes 1968, 1973; Zahle 2007). Following upon these debates, discussion of the issue appeared in a number of academic journals in philosophy and sociology. This literature fed into the professional canon of Anglophone "philosophy of social science," a field coming close to its contemporary shape in the 1950s-1980s. This era saw the emergence of debates about the reducibility of the social to the individual, as well as about the putative need for mechanism-based explanations of social phenomena, in the social sciences (see Zahle 2007 for review). It is the later, professionalized phases of the debate to which the new volume seeks to make a contribution.

Probably the most advanced discussion of its theme on the academic market today, this collection also provides an excellent introduction to many themes in contemporary analytic philosophy of social science in general. Nonetheless, the book displays some weaknesses. In what follows I first recount and discuss the contents of the essays individually, then briefly discuss one weakness of the volume as a whole.

The editors organize the papers into two groups: those focused on the ontology of individuals and societies, and those focused on questions of social science methodology (especially theories of explanation). In accordance with this breakdown, they summarize the main questions of the volume as follows: "[1] What is the ontological status of social phenomena and, as part of this, their relationship to individuals? [2] To what extent may, and should, social scientific explanations focus on individuals and social phenomena respectively?" (1-2). While this is a perfectly reasonable way of organizing the papers, I will discuss the papers in a slightly different order here, to suggest another way of thinking about them.

Two useful observations that emerge from a number of papers in the volume are, first, that what counts as an "individualist" or "holist" account is itself a contested matter; and, second, that some self-ascribed "holist" accounts take forms very similar or even consistent with what other authors describe as "individual" accounts, and vice versa. These observations motivate efforts to carefully distinguish among the positions that have been called "individualist" or "holist," so as to effectively track the actual theoretical consequences of, and arguments for and against, one or another position within this variety.

Though the precise distinctions are often drawn slightly differently from one essay to the next, a few of the more common and important distinctions are those between

(a) the question of whether or not individuals are socially constituted
(b) the question of whether or not individuals are socially constrained
(c) the question of whether or not social-level entities and events are reducible to
 individual-level entities and events
(d) the question of whether or not social entities (groups, etc.) can be agents
(e) ontological vs. methodological formulations of the distinction

Some individualists have given a "yes" answer to (a), while giving a "no" answer to (b) and/or (c). (See Pettit, Little, and discussion by Zahle.) Methodological holists, however, often suppose that a "yes" answer to (a) is itself a concession to holism (Elder-Vass). This disagreement is partly merely terminological, but also potentially substantive. Another disagreement concerns whether a "yes" answer to (d) entails a "yes" answer to (b), with Pettit arguing that it does not, and Szigeti arguing that it does.

Epstein's essay articulates and defends a variety of individualism that does not hold social phenomena to be "built" out of individuals (as individualist accounts usually do), but rather to be "anchored" in beliefs or practices common to individuals in the group. Epstein offers David Hume's "conventions" and John Searle's "institutional facts" as examples. Epstein's analysis of the structure of various possible anchoring relations, and their implications for the individualism-holism debate, deserves more attention than I can give it here. The essay leaves me wondering, however, when and how individual beliefs or practices become common enough to count as "social" on an anchor individualist account; how the identity of social facts is to be determined under conditions of change or breakdown in these facts; and what justifies the correlation between individual facts and social facts that one or another anchor individualist answer to these questions would (seemingly) have to draw.

As an alternative to familiar "levels-based" views of micro-macro relations, Ylikoski suggests a "scale-based" view wherein we address micro-macro distinctions (including the distinction between individuals and social wholes) in terms of the size of the entities appealed to within an account or explanation. Human individuals are physically smaller than groups and societies, for instance. Two interesting consequences of the shift that Ylikoski recommends are (i) a reconstrual of the micro-macro relation as context-relative (thus eliding problems regarding the specification of a "lowest level") and (ii) recognition of cases wherein relatively small ("micro") events can have effects on relatively large ("macro") systems, and vice versa: the mosquito that initiates an outbreak of yellow fever, for instance, or the effect of U.S. tax policy on the investment decisions of an individual taxpayer. Ylikoski's analysis is elegant and brilliant. Because "levels-based" thinking is (admittedly confusingly) also associated with other distinctions, however -- such as the greater or lesser generality of claims made at different levels -- I suggest that levels-based discourse ought not be thrown out too callously.

Pettit's essay provides a usefully condensed recapitulation of arguments he has presented elsewhere in more detail. Pettit distinguishes three different controversial positions relevant to the "individualism-holism" question: "individualism," the view that social phenomena do not compromise individual agency; "atomism," the view that social properties are not part of the constitution of individual agents; and "singularism," the view that only single individuals, and not groups or collectives, can be agents. Pettit argues for individualism, anti-atomism, and anti-singularism.

Szigeti takes issue with Pettit's view, arguing that individualism and anti-singularism are incompatible (113-114). In brief, Szigeti's argument is as follows: Theories of group agency must be causal or non-causal. Causal construals have the result that either (a) group-agency reduces to individual agency, or (b) group agency constrains individual agency. Non-causal construals of group agency, on the other hand, are hard to read as attributions of agency at all (since agency presumably involves the ability to have effects). While Szigeti's subtle arguments deserve fuller discussion, I suspect they rely on questionable assumptions about the uniformity of the structure of causality in different kinds of systems or processes (or, in different contexts of explanation).

Another major theme of the book concerns the relation between ontological and methodological conceptions of the individualism-holism debate, with some authors drawing methodological conclusions from ontological premises, and others arguing for a wholesale shift of the debate away from ontology and towards methodology.

Elder-Vass argues in favor of holism over individualism on the basis of a relatively straightforward two-step argument: (1) an account of the ontology of individuals and social phenomena, and (2) an argument that certain relations of individuals can and will produce social phenomena that are not reducible to the features of those individuals and their relations. In (1), Elder-Vass takes care to argue that no features ascribed to "individuals" can be due to relations with other individuals, since, if they were, these "individuals" would have been already admitted to be socially constituted (and, hence, the methodological individualists would have lost from the outset). In (2), Elder-Vass argues that there are obviously social phenomena that cannot be articulated solely in terms of the so-delimited features of individuals. Hence, methodological individualism is a failure. Elder-Vass also introduces the notion of "norm circles" (which he has employed in more detail elsewhere) and gives an account of their (non-individualistically-reducible) causal powers.

Zahle takes issue with Elder-Vass's argument, claiming that step (1) need not convince individualists. In particular, they will see no compelling reason to deny themselves a definition of "individuals" that holds them to be socially constituted (as noted above, this is a move made by several contemporary individualists: for instance, Little and Pettit). Zahle recommends an alternative to Elder-Vass's "ontological" criterion for evaluating the individualism-holism distinction, which she calls a "pragmatic" criterion, and formulates it as follows:

a good reason in support of a particular distinction between individualist and holist explanations . . . is a reason which shows, in an acceptable manner, that the distinction, drawn in the same manner in all contexts, is useful from the perspective of explaining the social world. (192)

I'm suspicious of the requirement that the distinction be "drawn in the same manner in all contexts." On what grounds should we insist on this? Maybe there are a variety of different distinctions that are conflated within traditional "holism-individualism" distinctions, but nonetheless each has independent validity. I'm also unsure about the terms "acceptable" and "useful," at least so far as they've been clarified and argued for here.

Kincaid argues that some of the issues classified under the "individualism-holism" debate are dead (no longer interesting or fruitful), while others are live (interesting and fruitful). The former category includes (i) the question of the reducibility of social-level phenomena to individual-level phenomena, (ii) the question of whether appeal to individual-level mechanisms is necessary in order to adequately explain social-level phenomena (the so-called "micro-foundations" debate), and (iii) the question of whether or not society is a fiction. The live issues are focused on the question, "how holist or individualist can or must we be?" (147), in regard to puzzles that arise within one or another project of empirical social scientific research.

Van Bouwel articulates and defends a model of explanation in the social sciences that is amenable to explanatory pluralism, and then argues for a move from ontological and monist construals of the individualism-holism debate, to a position that advances "explanatory pluralism" (161).

Another theme that runs through the volume in a strong way is the question of which models of individual agency would be sufficient or insufficient, illuminating or unilluminating, within social scientific inquiry. Nuanced discussions of pragmatist (Little), practice-theoretic (Risjord), ecological (Risjord), actor-network (Collin), and game-theoretic (Little, Risjord, McCubbins and Turner) models of individual agency provide a surprising and refreshing subsidiary theme of the volume.

Little seeks to supplement his earlier work on individualism and micro-foundations by developing a sufficiently robust account of the agents making up the "individual level" in social explanations. To this end he provides a critical review of pragmatist models of agency and their sociological application -- in particular, work by John Dewey, G. H. Mead, Neil Gross, Andrew Abbott, Mark Granovetter, and Hans Joas. These models are contrasted with Aristotelian and rational-choice models. From this comparative perspective, the novelties and advantages of the various pragmatist options come into relief very nicely, but the limited scope of the contrast class may be partly responsible for the attractiveness and apparent novelty of the pragmatist positions.

Collin reconstructs Bruno Latour's intellectual trajectory through the lens of the individualism-holism debate, including Latour's early-career ethnographies of science, his mid-career articulation of a metaphysics of "actants," and his late-career methodological reflections on actor-network-theory as a framework for social scientific research. Collin's main aim is to say to what extent and in what ways Latour has been a methodological individualist or holist at different points in his career, and what lessons we can draw, regarding this opposition, from his contributions and difficulties. Of course, this strategy involves reading Latour in terms of problems and questions he might not himself recognize as the central ones, but Collin mostly handles the risks associated with this procedure very effectively.

Risjord provides an argument for a new "ecological" model of agency, wherein "to be an agent requires treating others as agents and responding to the joint possibilities for action provided by the environment" (219). Risjord begins with an analysis of the behavior of musicians in a jazz ensemble. He then argues that two common accounts of agency -- rational actor and practice-theoretic (the latter represented by Pierre Bourdieu and Anthony Giddens) -- cannot make sense of this behavior. Finally, he proposes an alternative model of agency that recognizes the characteristically human capacities of (a) recognizing environmental affordances in one's own case, (b) recognizing the affordances of other agents with whom one is in interaction, (c) thus being able to imaginatively trade roles with them and share a common "attunement" to a shared environment, and (d) being able to "meta-cognitively" reflect on "prior plans, explicit beliefs about the environment, knowledge of explicit rules, and interpretations" (234). This model's advantage over Bourdieu's and Giddens's accounts is that it is able to explain the possibility of change, including breakdowns and subsequent recoveries, of the coordinated action of groups of individuals. Its advantage over rational actor models is in sufficiently recognizing the role of the environment (broadly construed), rather than solely the representational states of the agents involved, in coordinated group action.

McCubbins and Turner provide an experimentally-based argument against a variant on traditional game theory known as "behavioral game theory." As the behavioral expectations of traditional game theory have regularly been disconfirmed, behavioral game theory seeks to develop empirically-based qualifications of game-theoretic predictions and models. McCubbins and Turner point out that behavioral game theory's strategy relies on the assumption that individual preferences can be generalized from one context to others; they then report on new experiments supporting the conclusion that such preferences do not generalize.

Despite its many strengths, the book manifests some weaknesses. I will discuss just one of these here.

The traditional opposition between social wholes and individuals rings a bit hollow to contemporary ears, not only because the poles of the opposition are only vaguely or ambiguously conceived, nor solely because one suspects that they are hardly mutually exclusive, but also because this opposition doesn't include, within the scope of potentially relevant factors it considers, those that are non-human or sub-personal (such as, for instance, human biology, ecology, and artifacts and technology). What happens in human affairs is very plausibly constrained, enabled, and affected by a combination of factors classifiable as ecological, biological, and technological, in addition to "individual" and "social." Since the first three kinds of factors operate in ways that cross-cut the individual-social distinction, and (on some conceptions of the individual or the social) are not included within the framework of that distinction at all, the inherited individualism-holism opposition, and the traditional question of the reducibility or non-reducibility of the social to the individual, are problematic in a way that most contributors to the volume never address. (A common pattern in the volume is to mention such factors as possibly relevant, but not to discuss them in any detail: for instance, regarding artifacts, pp. 58, 121-122, 143, 145-146, 212; regarding sub-personal factors, p. 150.) To some extent, Risjord's and Collin's essays, and a few paragraphs of McCubbins and Turner's (240), are a refreshing exception to this general criticism.

For examples of alternative approaches to the relation between the individual and the social, which do not pass quietly over such sub-personal and non-human factors, see John Protevi's analysis of the relation between somatic, technological, and social processes "below," "alongside," and "above" the subject (respectively), in Protevi 2009 and 2013; Lenny Moss and Vida Pavesich's analysis of differential access to embodied skill-formation in Moss and Pavesich 2011; and Moss's critique of methodological individualism on the basis of a reconstruction of human evolutionary history (Moss 2014), which also points to the role of sub-personal social processes in the constitution of human individuality.


Lukes, Steven. 1968. "Methodological Individualism Reconsidered." The British Journal of Sociology, Vol. 19 (2): 119-129.

Lukes, Steven. 1973. Émile Durkheim, his Life and Work: A Historical and Critical Study. London, UK: Penguin.

Moss, Lenny, and Pavesich, Vida. 2011. "Science, Normativity, and Skill: Reviewing and Renewing the Anthropological Basis of Critical Theory." Philosophy and Social Criticism 37 (2): 139-165.
Moss, Lenny. 2014. "Detachment and Compensation: Groundwork for a Metaphysics of 'Biosocial Becoming'." Philosophy and Social Criticism, 40 (1): 91-105.

Protevi, John. 2009. Political Affect: Connecting the Social and the Somatic. Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press.
Protevi, John. 2013. Life, War, Earth: Deleuze and the Sciences. Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press.

Zahle, Julie. 2007. "Holism and Supervenience." In Stephen P. Turner and Mark Risjord (eds.), Philosophy of Anthropology and Sociology. Amsterdam, Netherlands: Elsevier, pp. 311-341.