Rhapsody of Philosophy: Dialogues with Plato in Contemporary Thought

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Max Statkiewicz, Rhapsody of Philosophy: Dialogues with Plato in Contemporary Thought, Penn State Press, 2009, 216pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271035406.

Reviewed by Sara Brill, Fairfield University



Like many of the contemporary thinkers with whom he engages, Max Statkiewicz diagnoses the impact of Platonism on contemporary western thought as a function of a selective reading of Plato’s critique of poetry, one which overlooks the complexity of the dialogues’ treatment of representation. Thus, at its most general, his Rhapsody of Philosophy: Dialogues with Plato in Contemporary Thought comprises a series of meditations upon Gilles Deleuze’s oft-quoted claim that Plato himself made the first step in overturning Platonism. More specifically, the book has two trajectories: to illustrate an element of Platonic thought (its “rhapsodic” dimension) that has not been sufficiently attended to by what Statkiewicz identifies as the two main camps of Plato scholarship (the traditional and the dramatic) and to draw out the connection between this element and the work of a number of contemporary theorists, a connection which should point the way toward a fuller dialogue between ancient and contemporary thought. What Statkiewicz means by “rhapsodic” unfolds throughout the book, but is presented in the introduction as “the mode of thinking — Plato’s mode, replayed in the texts of Nietzsche, Heidegger, Jacques Derrida, Luce Irigaray, Deleuze, Nancy, Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe — that challenges the dominance of univocal interpretation, as well as the corresponding treatise format, in the modern philosophical tradition” (4).

According to Statkiewicz, both the approach to the dialogues that seeks rigorously maintained propositions and the approach that emphasizes the dramatic and dialogic character of Plato’s work share the assumption that an interpretation of the dialogues rises and falls with one’s capacity to uncover the intention of Plato the author. Because the variety of voices and gestures that appear in the dialogues defy reduction to the single voice of Plato, appeals to authorial intent overlook the radical polysemia of the dialogues; that is, according to Statkiewicz, such appeals overlook their rhapsodic character. What is gained, then, in attempting a rhapsodic dialogue with Plato, is resistance to a trend that fails to do justice to the dialogues themselves and that forecloses the possibility of “authentic dialogue” with Plato: “Only a genuinely rhapsodic reading will be able to respect the integrality of a dialogue and at the same time set into play its mimetic character” (14).

Thus, to take up a metaphor Statkiewicz uses in his introduction, this book fights a battle on many fronts. In between its “Polemic Introduction” and its “Rhapsodic Conclusion,” its four chapters develop the book’s main themes by presenting the engagement of a variety of thinkers with passages from the Republic, the Phaedrus, the Sophist and the Timaeus.

In Chapter 1, “Platonic Theater: Rigor and Play in the ”“>Republic (Genette and Lacoue-Labarthe),” Statkiewicz highlights the significance of “rigor” (akribeia) in the Republic, arguing that akribeia acts as the impulse behind the allocation of types and social rules that figure so prominently in the foundation of the city and the presence of justice within it. At the same time, Socrates’ appeal to and employment of akribeia involves a playful and mimetic component that constantly unsettles and disturbs the types and roles that Socrates establishes. This playful, rhapsodic dimension of the dialogue is missed by those thinkers, Heidegger and Genette in particular, who focus on Book 10’s conception of mimesis rather than book 3’s, that is to say, who view mimesis in the Republic through the lens of representation rather than performance.

In Chapter 2, “”“>Le Beau Jeu: the play of Beauty and Truth in the ”“>Phaedrus (Nietzsche, Heidegger, Derrida),” Statkiewicz turns to the infamous palinode of the Phaedrus in order to examine Heidegger and Derrida’s engagement with Nietzsche’s attempt to overturn Platonism by means of their reformulation of the quarrel between philosophy and poetry on the one hand and the discord between art and truth on the other, both of which they see at work in this dialogue. Statkiewicz argues that the unity of the Phaedrus consists in its replaying the opposition between philosophy and poetry, i.e., in its rhapsodic dimension. While the chapter attempts to illustrate this dimension of the palinode, much of the chapter is occupied with defending the critique of Heidegger’s treatment of the Phaedrus implicit in Derrida’s own work on the dialogue. According to Statkiewicz, Derrida’s use of play, like Nietzsche’s trope of “woman,” opens up the poetic dimension of the palinode in a manner that Heidegger simply failed to take into account, a failure that requires a reconsideration of Heidegger’s assessment of Nietzsche’s attempt to overturn Platonism.

Chapter 3, “The Notion of (Re)Semblance in the ”“>Sophist (Deleuze, Foucault, Nancy),” presents its principal theorists as resisting the temptation to treat the ontological investigations and the dramatic setting of the dialogue separately while also criticizing these thinkers for failing to note the relationship between what Statkiewicz views as the two features of the dialogue that most complicate its dialectical divisions: the difference between image and simulacrum and that between philosopher and sophist. Statkiewicz locates Deleuze’s illustration of Plato’s own overturning of Platonism in Deleuze’s work on the challenge simulacra (non-resembling images) and repetition pose to the structure of representation. Statkiewicz then draws out Foucault’s kinship with Deleuze, as evinced by Foucault’s engagement with modern painting, on the question of the distance between repetition and resemblance. Both Foucault’s analysis of Magritte and Deleuze’s analysis of the work of Francis Bacon reveal, according to Statkiewicz, an irreducible representational element at work in the play between image and simulacrum, a play that is well captured by the work of mimesis in the Sophist. Finally, Statkiewicz turns to Nancy’s work, arguing that it illuminates the rhapsodic dimension of the dialogue and reveals the mimetic gesture that occupies the heart of philosophy in its very attempt, doomed to failure, to distinguish itself from sophistry. Statkiewicz concludes this chapter by reflecting on Nancy’s development of the iconic and rhapsodic aspects of mimesis at work in the Sophist, asserting that the play between these two is what grants to art and to the Platonic dialogue itself the possibility of subverting as well as enforcing a dominant ideological structure:

Plato’s text itself weaves (or stitches — rhaptei) together such apparently incompatible epistemological, aesthetic, and ontological categories as myth and the method of division, mimesis and diegesis, being and nonbeing, and image and simulacrum in the double, questioning movement of the serious play of (re)semblance (131).

Chapter 4, “The Abyssal Ground of World and Discourse in the ”“>Timaeus (Kristeva, Irigaray, Butler, Derrida),” offers an account of the interrogations undertaken by these thinkers of the ontic and political significance of the Timaean chora. According to Statkiewicz, all of these theorists see a connection between chora and mimesis as both destabilizing and threatening the hierarchies and conceptual apparatus of Platonism from within the Platonic dialogues themselves. What sets these thinkers apart from more traditional interpretations of the dialogue, and sets Derrida apart in an exemplary way, is what renders them rhapsodic according to Statkiewicz: their various efforts to stitch together “the scientific, cosmological content of the dialogue and its dramatic and political frame” (135). Statkiewicz himself will insist upon the need to read the controversial sense of chora in the Timaeus as the “receptacle” of being with the more pedestrian sense of the word as “place” or “region.” This chapter begins by identifying the role of mimesis in the Timaeus, with appeal to both the Republic and the Critias, as bound up with the dialogue’s reflection on becoming, and as connected to chora (understood in its relation to the social and political field of established social roles and political identities) by means of their shared destabilization of roles and identities: “The chora opens up a ‘leeway,’ a ”“>Spielraum, a space of play with the il-lusions of mimesis.” (144). Thus, chora, like mimesis, presents the possibility of a resistance to the rigorous attribution of roles and status; it is this capacity for resistance that draws the attention of the various theorists Statkiewicz surveys in the rest of the chapter.

Statkiewicz concludes by critiquing Gadamer’s hermeneutic approach to the Platonic dialogues on the grounds that its privileging of the attainment of univocal meaning neutralizes the gesture toward plurality and difference that it makes on the way to such a meaning. He then turns to offer an extended reading of the Ion designed to bring together the preceding discussion of contemporary engagements with Plato and to trace out a dialogue between poetry and thought. Statkiewicz then ends by developing his notion of dialogue, with help from Heidegger and Nancy, as a rhapsodic community of readers (189) in which all roles and voices are open to all participants.

As Statkiewicz makes clear in the introduction, the book’s aim is less to offer an interpretation of Plato’s dialogues than to observe the “rhapsodic confrontation with Platonism” in the work of a number of contemporary theorists (27). He does make claims about the significance and meaning of particular passages in the dialogues; however, a few of these claims are controversial. For instance, the characterization of Thrasymachus as the actor/sophist whose rhapsodic intrusion provides a foil to Socrates’ supposed valorization of akribeia leaves much to be desired. After all, as Statkiewicz himself acknowledges, it is Thrasymachus who introduces the standard of precision and Statkiewicz’s main argument for why we should really attribute it to Socrates in the Republic (that Plato’s audience would have associated akribeia with Socrates given what we know of Socrates’ reputation 41) is not persuasive. This reviewer found the claim that akribeia is the most significant force in the dialogue difficult to accept in the absence of a careful discussion of the infamous “longer way” passage, and the claim that the exchange between Socrates and Thrasymachus is the most spectacular of the dialogue (40) to overstate the case.

Equally unconvincing is Statkiewicz’s characterization of the function of dramatic readings of the dialogues, namely, “to control the character of the text, which it regards as univocal or at least as regularly polysemic” (24), especially when Statkiewicz himself gives little consideration to such vivid interlocutors as Glaucon and Adeimantus while making claims about the character of the Republic as a whole and when Statkiewicz’s own appeals to the dramatic dimensions of the dialogues suggest there is room for significant exchange between Statkiewicz and these scholars. Many of the authors Statkiewicz surveys have dedicated volumes to drawing out the rich ambiguities and polyvocity of the dialogues. Statkiewicz would need to pay more attention to these scholars to convince this reviewer that they have all failed in their efforts.

For readers interested in the rich and long-standing engagement of contemporary continental thought with the Platonic dialogues, Statkiewicz provides a roadmap to the work of many of this tradition’s main figures. Rhapsody of Philosophy is at its strongest when he is illustrating the depth of these theorists’ work with the Platonic dialogues. Statkiewicz’s review of feminist work on the Timaeus is particularly compelling. Making apparent why any of the thinkers he discusses felt the need to give sustained attention to Plato seems to be of less interest for Statkiewicz. He takes for granted that the reader will have ready to hand the dense network of philosophic questions that led these thinkers to turn toward Plato. He spends little time reminding us what is at stake in these encounters and thus risks closing off our own engagement with the issues and questions in which he is interested. This is unfortunate in a book that takes itself to gesture “toward an authentic dialogue between poetry and thought” (169).

The overall effect is thus less a book animated by questions that can be taken up than one animated by engagements whose stakes remain mysterious. When, for instance, Statkiewicz asks in chapter 2’s discussion of Derrida and Nietzsche, whether the “apparent ambiguity as to play and woman require a modification of Heidegger’s view of Nietzsche’s attempt to overturn Platonism and to reconfigure the relationship between art and truth,” (92) this reviewer suspects she is not alone in feeling a bit lost in the question’s winding threads of reference. While I would agree with Statkiewicz that sorting them out is worth doing, Statkiewicz himself gives the reader little reason why this is the case, or how to go about doing so.

This is also true for the overall structure of the book, whose many section titles tell the reader what is happening but not why. Perhaps Statkiewicz would defend this structure on the grounds of the rhapsodic character of his own writing. This is in fact a move he makes in justifying the rather sweeping claim that only the rhapsodic reading he champions is capable of resisting the dominant interpretation of Plato’s work on representation: “The hubris of ‘my’ claim may perhaps be mitigated by the hubris of another claim: that of the rhapsodic mode to undermine the subjectivity of the ‘I claim’ or ‘I speak’” (26). But the effect of the book’s ‘rhapsodic’ structure is less an opening of dialogue than a series of observations whose connections with one another are left unsaid.

In the end, in wishing to resist an appeal to authorial intent while continuing to make claims about Plato’s mode of thought and the possibility for authentic dialogue, Statkiewicz walks a fine line between illuminating an under-recognized dimension of the dialogues and falling into a kind of parody that is neither profound nor provocative. There is a difference between calling into question the standard of authorial intent (a standard that thinkers like Derrida have so effectively illustrated as fraught and laden with a variety of less than thoughtful motivations) and denying the conditions of a work’s composition. The former can powerfully illustrate the stultifying and dangerous effects of claiming privileged access to a text, while the latter risks mystifying and obfuscating the very conditions through which a text’s polysemia and polyvocity operate.