Richard Wollheim on the Art of Painting: Art as Representation and Expression

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Van Gerwen, Rob (ed.), Richard Wollheim on the Art of Painting: Art as Representation and Expression, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 285pp, $54.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-521-80174-5.

Reviewed by David Hills, Stanford University


It’s a well-kept secret, but we’re living in a golden age of philosophical art criticism. In recent years a handful of philosophers, equipped with a deep and well-informed love of particular works of art and insights gleaned from philosophy’s long-running debates about mind, knowledge, meaning, and agency, have turned themselves into exemplary critics, clarifying and enriching the terms on which art is understood and valued these days, even by artists. One of the most distinguished of these philosopher-critics is Richard Wollheim. In his 1984 Mellon Lectures, published in 1987 as Painting as an Art, he offered fresh, compelling, intricately crafted readings of such painters as Poussin, Ingres, Manet, and Picasso, and he used these readings to present and defend a distinctive account of the nature and sources of pictorial meaning, an account he continues to defend and refine.

Wollheim gave “On Pictorial Representation” as the Gareth Evans Memorial Lecture at Oxford in 1996; it then became the topic of a symposium published in the Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism in 1998. In 1997 van Gerwen organized an interdisciplinary conference on Wollheim’s work at the University of Utrecht. The current volume begins with the Wollheim’s Oxford lecture, pools papers from the JAAC symposium with papers from the Utrecht conference, and concludes with concise but trenchant replies by Wollheim to his critics. The result is a rich and varied sample of the ways his work has been taken up and argued with so far.

The sample is far from comprehensive. Some of Wollheim’s most persistent and eloquent critics are missing from the volume, notably Kendall Walton. So are some of the less familiar kinds of pictorial meaning discussed in the Mellon Lectures, notably visual metaphor. Some of the contributors have written about him at greater length and to better effect elsewhere. The Utrecht pieces are often programmatic, sketchy, and breathlessly, breathtakingly brief. Everybody gets down to the business of applying, adapting or criticizing Wollheim without pausing to explain him first, and some of the most interesting pieces misread him at important points. In no way does this volume constitute an introduction to Wollheim’s work. But anyone who cares about the philosophy of painting will want to study it and come to terms with it at some point.

For reasons of space, this short review takes up a handful of contributions dealing with pictorial meaning in general and representation in particular. A longer version, dealing with the full range of contributors and a wider range of topics, may be found at: 1

These two awarenesses are said to be distinguishable but inseparable aspects of a single experience, an experience of seeing-in: seeing the relevant three-dimensional things in the relevant surface. The configurational aspect can be described on analogy with a veridical simple seeing of a differentiated surface, which it resembles both intrinsically and in functional role. The recognitional aspect can be described on analogy with a face-to-face seeing of the things we in fact merely see in the surface (or alternatively, on analogy with an optically unaided visualization of those same things). Yet I can be aware of a differentiated surface in the particular way exhibited here only by using the surface to discern absent three-dimensional things; and I can be aware of discerned absent things in the particular way exhibited here only by being aware of a differentiated surface whose features enable me to discern them in it. In at least this sense, (a) and (b) are inseparable aspects of a single experience rather than independent experiences that happen to occur simultaneously. And though they can be described on analogy with the simpler experiences just mentioned, there is a sense in which a detailed point-for-point comparison between them and such simpler experiences is out of the question: seeing-in and the simpler experiences to which it is in various ways analogous are “phenomenologically incommensurate.”2 Such, Wollheim thinks, is the twofoldness involved in seeing-in. A painting represents a given subject matter when we are retrievably intended to see that subject matter in its surface and can indeed do so.

Wollheim has pointed out that since our experience of trompe l’oeil paintings isn’t characterized by twofoldness, trompe l’oeil paintings don’t count as representations by his standards. This troubles Jerrold Levinson, who wants to replace the notion of seeing-in explained by Wollheim with a less demanding notion that doesn’t require configurational awareness. His candidate is seeing-from, where one sees object X from design D if and only if:

(a) actually looking at D gives one the impression of seeing X, makes it seem to one as if one is seeing X, and
(b) the impression or seeming in question is caused by mechanisms appropriately similar to those it would be caused by in an actual face-to-face seeing of X.

(Having the impression of seeing X needn’t involve the slightest tendency to believe that X is actually before one’s eyes.) Levinson insists on this change in part because he wants to treat trompe-l’oeil paintings as representations, in part because he thinks that when we look at pictures whose means of depiction are routine and of little aesthetic interest (e.g. passport photos), we lack interest in and hence awareness of the configurational properties responsible for our experience. This seems to me to confuse what we’re aware of with what we attend to. Lack of interest may sometimes extinguish attention, but it isn’t enough to extinguish awareness, as those of us who bore easily know all too well. In any case, I don’t know how to interpret the notion of being under the impression of seeing X so as to get this proposal off the ground. To experience the subject matter of a Rembrandt sketch I must remain vividly aware that I’m seeing a monochromatic display of lines and splotches; it is by actively construing this display that I am made aware of this subject matter. So how can I be under the impression as I do so that I’m seeing a multicolored scene with edges in place of the lines?

Susan Feagin embraces Wollheim’s conclusion that trompe-l’oeil isn’t a species of representation, offers a positive account of what she calls trompe l’oeil presentation, and explores the aesthetic and cognitive interest of some famous examples of the genre. The account is engaging and perceptive, but it cries out for actual illustrations — and for certain distinctions that Feagin doesn’t draw. One is that between looking as much as possible like another thing and giving the illusion of being that other thing. Another is that between two semantically different kinds of trompe l’oeil, the kind where the painted surface dresses up as the surface of some other substance (wood, marble, …) and the kind where the painted surface disappears from sight and we instead seem to see various three-dimensional objects in front of or behind it (feathers, calling cards, crumpled envelopes, …).

I turn next to Wollheim’s own contribution to this volume, “On Pictorial Representation.” In Painting as an Art he briefly discussed what he called the fact of transfer: once we’ve familiarized ourselves with the relevant general pictorial idiom, we can learn to recognize representations of Fs by having actual Fs pointed out to us in the world, or we can learn to recognize actual Fs by having represented Fs pointed out to us in pictures. An account of what representation is should accommodate this fact; a developed account of how representation works should explain it. A first step in accommodating transfer is to contend that what a picture represents is determined by the content of some appropriate visual experience, obtainable from the picture on certain appropriate terms. A second step is to contend that if a picture represents a (possibly nonexistent) F as such, the appropriate experience must be one in which we are visually aware of a (possibly nonexistent) F as such, in that, given suitable prompting, the Fness of the F in question would come to be part of the visually presented content of the appropriate visual experience. Wollheim thinks these two principles powerfully constrain accounts of pictorial representation. He uses them to mount new and powerful objections to accounts in terms of pictorial syntax and semantics (Goodman, Harrison, etc.) and to accounts in terms of an experienced resemblance between the “visual fields” provided by pictures and their subjects (Christopher Peacocke, Malcolm Budd).

The transfer principles might seem to imply that the only properties things can be represented as having are those they could straightforwardly be seen to have when looking at them face to face. But Wollheim goes on to urge that this isn’t the case: the visual experiences appropriate to paintings can be “permeated by thought” so as to afford them a content richer than that of any veridical face-to-face seeing.

Wollheim goes on to criticize Walton’s account, which makes representation turn on imagining about one’s seeing of the painted surface that it is a seeing of the subject instead, and where something like twofoldness is secured by a requirement that the veridical experience of the surface and the imaginary experience of the face together constitute “a single phenomenological whole.”3

Wollheim concedes that in moving my hands around I can imagine myself to be conducting an orchestra, and in looking hard at an enemy I can imagine setting him on fire with my gaze. That is, I can engage in these activities in such a way that my doing them in that way counts as my imagining I am doing something else. But in doing one perceptual thing (looking at a painted surface), I can’t imagine that I am doing some other perceptual thing (looking at a face) instead. “For, if we succeed, what is left of seeing the surface when I successfully imagine it to be some other experience? However, if I do continue to see the surface, or this experience retains its content, how have I succeeded in imagining it, the experience, to be an experience of seeing a face?” (25). The best interpretation I’m able to put on this complaint goes as follows:

(a) Like Wollheim, Walton wants to regard configurational awareness and recognitional awareness as aspects of a single visual experience.
(b) Therefore, we aren’t to suppose I have two separate simultaneous experiences, a seeing of the surface plus an imagining (as it were from outside) about this seeing of a surface that it is a seeing of a face instead.
(c) Rather, we must suppose that in seeing the surface as I do, I imagine myself seeing a face instead, where this means that I see the surface in such a way that so seeing it already counts as imagining seeing, hence visualizing, the face instead.
(d) For this to be the case, my experience of seeing the surface would need to be simultaneously (i) a visual experience (in particular, a seeing) that is unambiguously and as a whole to the effect that a surface is before my eyes and thus and so, and (ii) a visual experience (in particular, a visualizing) that is unambiguously and as a whole to the effect that a face is before my eyes and thus and so.
(e) Yet no single visual experience can be unambiguously and as a whole to two different and incompatible propositional effects.

Questions could be raised about (e), but I’ll confine myself here to challenging (b). Walton requires that perceiving and imagining “constitute a single phenomenal whole” in this respect: we see what we do only because of what we are imagining and imagine what we do only because of what we are seeing, and the dependence relations in both directions are intimate and intricate; many different small variations in what we see would entail many different small variations in what we imagine (and vice versa). Walton doesn’t require that they constitute a single phenomenal whole in the stronger sense that they each consist exclusively in one and the same token visual experience, and I’m not sure what phenomenological evidence Wollheim could offer for this stronger singularity claim once the two are distinguished.

Michael Podro takes over from Wollheim’s Art and Its Objects the suggestion that a pictorial representation proposes a kind of analogy or figurative likening whose terms are the marked surface D on the one hand and the subject X on the other. He takes over from I.A. Richards and Max Black an interactionist view of figuration, on which every deep analogy restructures our thinking about both its terms, reshaping our thought about each on the model of our thought about the other, in ways that derive their power and interest from a continued appreciation of how different the terms are in other respects.

On the recognitional side of things, Podro insists that for representation to occur, it isn’t enough that our inspection of the surface design D activate our capacity to recognize subject X in X’s acknowledged absence. We must go on to exploit our recognition of X in a sustained, successful effort to visualize X. (He might contend that this is an important difference between representations proper and the stylized minimal message-bearing icons encountered on airport signs, images whose interest as images is exhausted as soon as we recognize in them a lit cigarette, a suitcase, a woman wearing a dress.)

On the configurational side of things, he insists that when representation occurs, our awareness of a painted surface D is never simply an awareness that D is differentiated in particular ways (lighter here, darker there; redder here, greener there); it is always an awareness of D in terms of how we suppose these differentiations came into being, how we suppose the artist to have made his marks, how we take him to have handled his medium — an awareness, then, in terms of actual or hypothetical productive activity. There are at least two departures from Wollheim on this side of things. There is now a difference in structure and therefore a difference in kind between the configurational aspect of seeing a subject in a picture and the configurational aspect of (say) seeing a camel in the clouds. Representation is no longer the capture by a cultural practice of a mode of experience we humans already had in our phenomenological repertoire. And configurational awareness is no longer largely veridical as far as it goes; the impressions a painter’s marks give us about the manner of their own making may be as designedly fanciful as the impressions a dancer’s movements give about the manner of their making.

The detailed appreciation of a pictorial representation is in large part a reconstruction of how configurational and recognitional awareness restructure each other as we search the represented subject for real or fancied counterparts of the organizations, energies, gestures, etc. already discerned in the way the surface has been worked. There is no determinate border between the two awarenesses, by which Podro means:

(a) that two awarenesses overlap, in time and in psychic constituents, and
(b) that there is no telling how deep the analogy between design and subject runs or where it will give out on us — it feels inexhaustible.

Podro’s account is so bound up with the readings of particular works he has used to elaborate it that I can’t begin to do justice to it here; it’s one of the most important and perplexing developments the philosophy of painting has seen of late, and his presentation of it in this volume should be read alongside his 1998 book Depiction.

3. For discussion of further topics in the volume (expression, internal spectatorship) and further contributors to it (Svetlana Alpers, Michael Baxandall, Malcolm Budd, Paul Crowther, Caroline van Eck, Rob van Gerwen, Andrew Harrison, Robert Hopkins, Graham McFee, Monique Roelofs, Renée van de Vall, Caroline Wilde), see the longer online version of this review 1. I’m looking here at Manet’s Woman with a Parrot of 1866.

2. Painting as an Art (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988), 47.

3. Mimesis as Make-Believe: On the Foundations of the Representational Arts (Cambridge, Mass. and London: 1990), 295.