Ricoeur and the Post-Structuralists: Bourdieu, Derrida, Deleuze, Foucault, Castoriadis

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Johann Michel, Ricoeur and the Post-Structuralists: Bourdieu, Derrida, Deleuze, Foucault, Castoriadis, Scott Davidson (tr.), Rowman and Littlefield, 2015, 160pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781783480951.

Reviewed by Reviewed by Sebastian Purcell, SUNY Cortland


Johann Michel's superb, timely, and scholarly book addresses the whole body of Paul Ricoeur's hermeneutic philosophy. It suggests not only the reasons Ricoeur's philosophy should be understood as a sort of post-structuralism, but also why it fares better than its competitors on a broad range of topics fundamental to philosophy, including accounts of meaning, truth, ethics and justice. It should be of interest for all who make use of the work of Pierre Bourdieu, Jacques Derrida, Gilles Deleuze, Michel Foucault, or Cornelius Castoriadis, since Michel makes his case relative to each of these thinkers. The presentation is helped throughout by a readable and exact translation.

Michel's basic claim is that Ricoeur's philosophy, despite reputation, should be understood as "a unique variety of post-structuralism" (147). His argumentative burden, then, involves two facets: (i) a defense of the claim that Ricoeur's hermeneutic philosophy can plausibly be understood as a sort of post-structuralism, and (ii) that it is a "unique variety," by which Michel primarily intends that it is a relatively superior form of post-structuralism. Michel defends (i) in the introduction and conclusion. Yet because (ii) requires a detailed engagement with each thinker, defending that claim takes one through the arc of the five comparative chapters of the text. Of these chapters, three appeared previously in French journals of philosophy, though they are considerably reworked for inclusion in the book. Since the book's plan of argument is so clean, I follow it in this review as well.

In the "Introduction" and "Conclusion" Michel makes the case that Ricoeur's philosophy, though usually understood as a brand of hermeneutic phenomenology, can plausibly and fruitfully be understood as a form of post-structuralism. Part of the justification for this claim turns on the point that "post-structuralism," as a label, is somewhat loose. It is not, Michel notes "a school of thought in which one can find a constellation of thinkers but a retrospective reconstruction drawn from the history of ideas or the history of philosophy" (147). Not all thinkers grouped under this label thought of themselves as post-structuralists, and some even rejected it. So it is left to philosophic studies to justify inclusion or exclusion from this movement. Moreover, Ricoeur'sphilosophy clearly shares the post-structuralist aim of escaping the signifying system of closure (for meaning) under which structuralism operates. Ricoeur, in his philosophic career, finds three models of meaning that cannot be reduced to the structuralist understanding: the symbol, the text, and translation. Yet, like other post-structuralists, he comes to this conclusion only by beginning from structuralist assumptions, so that his three models of meaning may reasonably be understood as post-structuralist developments. These, briefly, are the grounds Michel suggests for reconsidering Ricoeur's work under the post-structuralist heading.

In response, one might wonder if Michel has not overlooked at least an implicit criterion for inclusion with this group, namely that one must be in some way "radical" or "subversive." In reading Derrida, Foucault, or Deleuze, for example, one has the sense that they are trying to break with established philosophic concerns and conventions -- even breaking with the need for logic itself (at points). Ricoeur's philosophy, by contrast, always feels comparatively conservative. His hermeneutic approach aims to mediate between incompatible sides, to produce a new third position, which functions (quite openly) as something like a Hegelian Aufhebung of the previous two positions. The results feel sensible rather than subversive. One wonders, then, whether Michel's argument gets the letter of the requirements right without addressing the spirit of the post-structuralist movement. The matter is at least a point to consider in moving to the main course of argument.

In the first chapter, Michel begins his primary task through a comparison of Ricoeur with Pierre Bourdieu. At a basic level, the chapter defends Ricoeur from two recent criticisms of his account of narrative identity in Oneself as Another. The criticisms suggest Ricoeur would do better to make use of a number of concepts in Bourdieu's sociological work on habits and personal identity. In response, Michel makes the case that Ricoeur, just like Bourdieu, shares the aim of resolving the paradox of personal identity by making sense of its "temporal invariance" (11). Where Ricoeur differs from Bourdieu is his introducing a self-reflexive moment into his account of personal identity. In addition to character (idem identity), which remains mostly stable across time, Ricoeur insists that the ability to promise (ipse identity) introduces a dimension of "distance" into one's personal identity. One can, as a result, become critical of one's own actions in a way that is similar only to Bourdieu's understanding of the sociologist observing her agents in a social setting. Ricoeur's account of personal identity, then, has all the elements of Bordieu's account, but it incorporates them in a way that is able to make sense of our ability for self-criticism and responsibility to others that Bourdieu's account lacks. Michel's careful analysis thus provides grounds for recognizing both why Ricoeur is not in need of further Bourdieusian concepts, and why Ricoeur's account of personal identity is more broadly comprehensive.

In chapter two, Michel broaches the exchanges Ricoeur and Derrida had through the course of the twentieth century. This chapter is likely the shining essay of book, itself worth the entire purchase price. It is a point-by-point analysis of each thinker's philosophy on the projects of escaping Hegelian closure, and developing aLevinasian ethics of alterity, justice, faith, and forgiveness. In the course of argument, Michel develops a number of novel replies to the deconstructionist critique of Ricoeur's philosophy.[1] Yet to understand their force, it will be helpful to pause in order to outline the stakes of the exchange.

At the heart of the deconstructionist criticisms of Ricoeur is the claim that his approach is too conservative, that it is not radical enough, not merely in style, but in its ability to twist free from the history of the metaphysics of presence, an approach typified by Hegel's dialectical philosophy.[2] Ricoeur, so the charge goes, is merely developing the "Western" metaphysical tradition with his sensible mediations between opposing sides, rather than subverting it. This is problematic for two reasons. First, because this tradition reduces the notion of "being" to a concept that indicates (roughly) a present, standing reserve. It does this so that it can be analyzed and transformed by instrumental reason. Yet, while the results are pragmatically helpful, this understanding of reality at the same time leaves no room for any deeper meaning in it. A metaphysics of presence, then, results in a nihilist existential crisis. Second, the premises on which the metaphysics of presence rest are unfounded. This claim is a broad one, which Derrida supports through his numerous engagements with "Western" philosophers.[3] What matters especially for Ricoeur is that Derrida makes the case that Husserl's phenomenology cannot function as a sort of foundational enterprise. Ricoeur, in developing phenomenology in a hermeneutic and post-structuralist way, thus fails to recognize the more radical non-foundation on which his own project rests. Moreover, even if what Ricoeur does is fine on its own, because his approach is not radical enough to break free from this tradition, he would only be exacerbating the problem of nihilism, rather than twisting free from it.

Michel offers two new responses to this sort of concern. First, he observes that in order to criticize the "Western" metaphysical tradition in this way, it is Derrida who must "totalize" it. This is to say that it is Derrida who must assume that this history is a complete and self-contained idea with no need for mediation -- something that his own deconstructions indicate does not exist. Ricoeur, by contrast, leaves open the possibility of understanding that history differently, and so avoids "totalizing" it. Second, Michel argues that Ricoeur's philosophy may plausibly be understood as a sort of "broken Hegelianism" never able to fully complete the dialectical process. It isn't, then, conservative in the way that deconstructionist criticism supposes. Moreover, Michel argues that it is Derrida's philosophy that should be understood as traditionally metaphysical, since it seeks only to substitute "difference, separation and alterity, for a thought of presence, unity, and identity" (37). Stated differently, it is Derridian deconstruction that merely inverts Hegel's dialectical philosophy, but fails to twist free from it. Michel's criticisms will likely be contested by those attracted to Derrida's philosophy, but the novelty of these criticisms marks their scholarly worth in this ongoing exchange.

The next two essays pursue a more ecumenical path, arguing that Ricoeur is able to affirm what Deleuze and Foucault support, without making many of their more contested commitments -- either metaphysically or epistemically. In "Outside the Subject and Becoming a Subject," Michel argues that Ricoeur's philosophy of subjectivity, both early and late, is able to support the anti-Cartesian and Stoic aspirations of Deleuze's work, without simply returning to a metaphysical project. He follows this analysis point by point concerning both authors' understanding of events, the dialectic of force and meaning in psychoanalysis, and the place of desire and law. The result is that Michel convincingly develops a Ricoeurian sense of Becoming a Subject without Deleuze's speculative metaphysical framework. In "The Care of the Self and Care for Others," Michel argues that Ricoeur's reflective hermeneutics may be understood as a form of care of the self in Foucault's sense (i.e., as a spiritual exercise, or askēsis). Michel outlines two moments for Ricoeur: an early aim to "become human and adult," which requires a sort of Socratic self-knowledge, and a second moment, articulated in Ricoeur's Oneself as Another, wherein this process of becoming adult is connected to an ethical aim (119). What this second moment shows, then, is that the care of the self, a sort of ethics beyond good and evil, can be brought into relation with the action guiding aims moral philosophy, an ethics of good and evil.

In the final chapter, Michel returns to his more confrontational style, arguing that while Castoriadis and Ricoeur are both engaged in a similar retrieval of the power of the imagination for political purposes, it is Ricoeur who provides better resources for political reflection on justice. The primary point of disagreement turns on one question: are our political institutions impediments to or the means by which justice is realized? Ricoeur answers that they are means to the realization of justice, while Castoriadis understands justice to function best when it is beyond its institutional form. Michel supports Ricoeur's position in this debate, since it seems that there is no other way forward politically without institutions. In doing so, Michel, likely unknowingly, lines Ricoeur up with the liberatory aspirations of various feminists and critical race theorists in the United States and Latin America.

In sum, the appearance of Michel's Ricoeur et ses contemporains in English translation is a welcome event. While I wish Michel had done a bit more to address the lingering suspicion aboutRicoeur's "conservative" style, the slim volume is crammed full of argumentative "bite" in defense of its two central claims. Because it has been written in clear and plain prose, it has much to offer anyone interested in contemporary post-structuralism, from the novice to the professional. It offers a great deal to consider regarding the fundamental issues of philosophy on meaning, identity, ethics and justice, even (perhaps especially) for those who are unlikely to persuaded by its central contentions.

[1] For what might be considered the "standard" response, see Patrick Bourgeois "Ethics at the limit of reason: Ricoeur and deconstruction," Philosophy Today, 41: Supplement (1997), 142-151.

[2] For a fuller development of these arguments, see John Caputo's grievances in (among other places) Radical hermeneutics: Repetition, Deconstruction, and the Hermeneutic Project, Bloomington & Indianapolis, IN: Indiana University Press (1987), and more recently in "God, perhaps: The diacritical hermeneutics of God in the work of Richard Kearney," Philosophy Today, 55: Supplement (2011): 56-64.

[3] I have in mind some of the following of Derrida's essays: Speech and Phenomena and Other Essays on Husserl's Theory of Signs, trans. David B. Allison (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1973), "Plato's Pharmacy" in Dissemination, trans. Barbara Johnson (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1983), 67-186, his engagement with Rousseau in Of Grammatology (Baltimore: John Hopkins University Press, 1974), and Of Spirit: Heidegger and the Question, trans. Geoffrey Bennington and Rachel Bowlby (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1991).