Ricoeur as Another: The Ethics of Subjectivity

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Cohen, Richard A. and James L. Marsh, (eds.), Ricoeur as Another: The Ethics of Subjectivity, SUNY Press, 2002, 239pp, $20.95, ISBN 0-7914-5190-9.

Reviewed by James Risser, Seattle University


Ricoeur as Another is a collection of essays devoted to interpreting Paul Ricoeur’s recent and perhaps crowning achievement, Oneself as Another. In his book, Ricoeur brings his work in hermeneutics, philosophy of language, and action theory to bear on the problem of selfhood in the context of contemporary discussions of “otherness.” Clearly, Ricoeur’s book deserves commentary and the overall merit of Ricoeur as Another is that it fills the need for commentary. All of the authors contributing essays to the volume are recognized scholars in the field of continental philosophy, and the editors have arranged the eleven essays that comprise the volume into two parts. In the first part the essays deal with the themes developed within Oneself as Another and for the most part stay within the boundaries of Ricoeur’s own thought. In the second part the essays explore the themes within Oneself as Another in relation to other contemporary thinkers. There is some unevenness in the quality of the individual contributions, but on the whole, this is a fine volume that succeeds in its purpose.

In the space of this review it is difficult and perhaps unnecessary to comment extensively on every essay. In what follows, I will provide some brief summaries and comment where appropriate. The first essay by Charles Reagen provides a needed and helpful overview of Oneself as Another. The overview concentrates on the issue of personal identity, paying close attention to Ricoeur’s “hermeneutic of the self that bridges the gap between the cogito and the anti-cogito” (7). Reagen devotes considerable attention to the last three chapters of Ricoeur’s book, which are devoted to ethics. He considers these chapters to be interesting in their own right and to constitute what in Ricoeur’s work amounts to his “groundwork for a metaphysics of morals.” In “The Doubleness of Subjectivity”, Lenore Langsdorf shows from the perspective of phenomenology how Ricoeur enables phenomenology to hold to a philosophy of the subject against contemporary critiques. She does this by situating Ricoeur’s philosophy of the subject, which is rooted in the phenomenon of attestation, between Husserl’s starting point in the cogito and a Nietzschean hermeneutics of suspicion, which destroys the cogito. Langsdorf then shows that from this middle position, Ricoeur’s subjectivity is a fragmented multiplicity that achieves coherence only in ongoing communication. The third essay by David Rasmussen considers the possibility of retrieving the phenomenon of subjectivity under the category of narrative identity. This essay, which in some way runs counter to the position of Langsdorf, shows that a theory of interlocution (pragmatics) can understand personal identity only in terms of sameness. Against this view, narrative identity, which is central to Ricoeur’s notion of selfhood, is able to make apparent the temporal dimension of selfhood and in this regard provides a more adequate notion of personal identity.

In his essay, John van den Hengel explores the epistemic-doxic status of the knowledge of human action within the framework of Ricoeur’s retrieval of Aristotle’s practical philosophy. This essay is remarkable for the breadth of its analysis of the issue and for its insight. At the core of his analysis, van den Hengel establishes three fundamental claims: 1) although Ricoeur makes use of the conceptual framework of action from analytic philosophy, he departs from the analytic tradition by focusing on the “who,” rather than on the “what” or “why” of action; 2) in making use of the role of narrative, Ricoeur’s discussion of action refuses to limit the discussion of action to action propositions; 3) unlike the analytic tradition which bases the ontology of action theory on events, Ricoeur bases the ontology of action theory on the self that is rooted in Aristotle’s ontology of actuality and potentiality. In light of these claims van den Hengel concludes that Ricoeur’s science of action remains within an appropriate dialectic between episteme and doxa.

Several of the essays in part two discuss Ricoeur’s work in relation to the philosophy of Levinas. Here a contrast of perspectives is noticeable, although the differences that emerge between the two essays in question are not necessarily incompatible. In his essay Patrick Bourgeois, a noted Ricoeur scholar, defends Ricoeur against Levinas. His thesis, though, is complex: he grants that Ricoeur’s critique of Levinas is too severe, but Ricoeur still needs Levinas for his overall argument, which Bourgeois sees as being directed at providing an alternative to “postmodern deconstruction.” Thus, it is a matter for Bourgeois of adjusting Ricoeur’s interpretation in deference to Levinas without altering Ricoeur’s own position. The contrast of perspective follows in the next essay written by Richard Cohen, a noted Levinas scholar who wants to defend Levinas in light of Ricoeur’s criticism. Cohen’s essay, which is the longest in the volume, is extremely helpful for gaining clarity on the differences between Ricoeur and Levinas as these differences emerge in Oneself as Another. Specifically, with analytic precision he takes the reader through chapters seven and ten of Oneself as Another, where Ricoeur deals most directly with Levinas. At the center of Cohen’s analysis is his claim that Ricoeur misunderstands the significance of the alterity of the other in Levinas and of the passivity of the self that responds to alterity. According to Cohen, Levinasian alterity does not leave the self unmoved, but reconditions it for a moral responsibility for the other. Cohen responds in a similar vein to Ricoeur’s more developed criticism of Levinas. He claims, for example, that Ricoeur’s critique of Levinas over the issue of conscience is weak. Against Ricoeur’s claim that Levinas reduces the voice of the other (conscience) to the otherness of other persons, Cohen argues that for Levinas it is not a matter of reducing different figures of alterity to one figure, but of grasping the alterity that makes any and all figures of alterity other.

In an essay that fits well with van den Hengel’s essay in part one, David Pellauer focuses on the issue of moral blindness in relation to the broader issue of practical wisdom and Ricoeur’s ethical reflections in Oneself as Another. The issue of moral blindness, which is implicit in Ricoeur’s work, is in effect the limit of practical wisdom, and with respect to this limit, there can be a practical maxim but not a deontological rule for action. Moreover, Pellauer claims that in our moral blindness we do not always know injustice or evil when we see it, or even when we suffer it. The final two essays in part two are both concerned with the issue of the ethico-political in Ricoeur’s thought. In the first of the two, Bernard Dauenhauer provides a Ricoeurian response to John Rawls’s contention that “in matters of justice there is a basic priority of the right over the good” (203). Dauenhauer’s argument focuses on Rawls’s derivation of rights from constitutional authority. He claims that ethical life is anterior to law and in fact is the basis on which constitutions are revised. Dauenhauer then claims that Ricoeur correctly turns to ethical life as the proper basis for issues of justice, especially regarding questions of distribution and universal norms. As with other contributors in this volume, Dauenhauer highlights the notion of practical wisdom that Ricoeur employs as the superior framework for these kinds of questions. In “The Right and the Good,” James Marsh explores Ricoeur’s notion of ethical selfhood in relation to the communicative ethics controversy. The controversy in communicative ethics pertains to a whole series of antinomies: is/ought, particular tradition/universal norm, justification/application, self/other. Marsh claims that Ricoeur’s work helps to solve the controversy. Marsh makes this claim in the basis of a threefold direction, which is laid out by Ricoeur in Oneself as Another: 1) to assert the primacy of ethics over morality; 2) to show the necessity for the ethical aim passing through and being tested by morality; 3) to show the necessity of having recourse to teleological aim when norms lead to conflict and antinomies.

In looking over these essays devoted to an understanding of Ricoeur’s work, it becomes apparent that Ricoeur is a philosopher who develops the direction of his thought by constantly integrating the various positions he encounters along the way, including that of analytic philosophy. Moreover, in looking over all the essays that comprise the volume, one sees certain emphases emerge. Chief among them is that Ricoeur can maintain a notion of selfhood in light of contemporary continental thought only with the aid of sophisticated distinctions, such as the distinction between idem identity (what is always the same) and ipse identity (the identity of a character that remains identifiable as it unfolds over time). In addition to this, Ricoeur roots his notion of ethical selfhood in a Marcelian notion of attestation that is sensitive to the demands of Aristotelian practical philosophy. If such is indeed the case, it would have been helpful to have further discussions that would continue to move beyond the confines of Ricoeur’s analysis to consider, for example, Derrida’s notion of self-identity or Gadamer’s relation to Ricoeur on the issue Aristotelian practical wisdom.