Ricoeur on Moral Religion: A Hermeneutics of Life

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James Carter, Ricoeur on Moral Religion: A Hermeneutics of Life, Oxford University Press, 2014, 169pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198717157.

Reviewed by David Pellauer, DePaul University


James Carter proposes a "selective reading" (p. v) of Ricoeur's philosophy that he claims reveals the "architectonic" (p. ix) of Ricoeur's thought. Contrary to many current interpretations of Ricoeur, which characterize his numerous writings under the heading of a philosophical anthropology, this organizing principle turns out to be a "moral religion," in effect, a "civic or common religion" (p. 96) that does not depend on any particular religious tradition but that does make it possible for people to live together and to seek a good life. This moral religion is said to be derived from the philosophy of agency worked out in Ricoeur's later work and retroactively discernible in the early work, based on a "reflexive understanding of autonomy" that entails a certain conviction which enables life together (p. 5). It is the emphasis on human capacity as fundamentally good that Carter sees in Ricoeur's later work that signals the possibility of such an interpretation.

There are three constitutive dimensions to this architectonic -- metaphysical, anthropological, and moral -- but finally it is founded on "life" (p. vi) as enabling the human capacities that are embedded within society. As should be evident, a fairly complex structure of interpretation underlies this enterprise. In terms of procedure, it proposes three steps: first an examination of Ricoeur's work that seeks not simply to present it, but also to reconstruct it; next comes an assessment of the coherence and consistency of Ricoeur's philosophical project as so reconstructed as a hermeneutics of ethical life; and finally the book ends with a brief consideration of what all this implies for a philosophy of religion that avoids the reigning debates in analytic and continental philosophy of religion (pp. 5-6, 14, 138n7). A second organizing factor is the claim that Ricoeur should be read in terms of three major figures who influence his thinking: Spinoza, Aristotle, and Kant. Taken together they "inform the different levels constituting Ricoeur's moral religion" by contributing "to a broader, richer philosophy of religion than could be achieved by any of their respective philosophies in isolation" (p. 100).

Spinoza is important because his idea of conatus provides Ricoeur with the idea of a dynamic metaphysics wherein "the capable subject" as active on the basis of a primary affirmation "culminates in the joyful recognition of oneself as inextricably bound up in the whole" (p. 8). Aristotle provides the anthropology that links such human capability in general to specific, concrete capacities. This is an anthropology that "involves human agents, human dispositions, the external world, and ultimately a much larger metaphysical reality" (p. 51). Moreover, in that agents are socially situated and interdependent, as can be seen in Aristotle's account of friendship, a note of historical vulnerability is introduced that shapes Ricoeur's understanding of human autonomy. The moral dimension comes in next as a response to the fragility signaled by this vulnerability as it relates to the search for a good life and responsibility toward others. Kant is important here because he considers the regulative boundary of this hermeneutics of the good life, providing not only the normative framework for it, but an underlying moral psychology for Ricoeur's moral religion. That is, while the categorical imperative serves "to safeguard against the human propensity for 'radical evil'" (p. 75), one must affirm the conviction that there is a fundamental goodness to the capable human being. It is the reflexive nature of this conviction that indicates the religious aspect to this conviction (p. 104). And, completing the hermeneutical circle at work here, it is this religious factor that governs "Ricoeur's appropriation of Spinoza, Aristotle, and Kant on ethical life" (p. 105).

What is named as "religion" here is basically functional. It is what serves "to bind human beings together in the collective moral improvement of the human race, aiming at the restoration of that fundamental goodness overshadowed -- but never completely destroyed -- by the corrupting influence of society" (p. 96). As a "moral religion," it is "differentiated from both moral psychology and ethical naturalism by the three dimensions of metaphysics, anthropology, and morality which the architectonic brings together" (p. 139). Not intended to replace particular religious traditions or doctrines, this moral religion is said to be valuable in a further way because it can confront these traditions and doctrines "to the extent that they fail to consistently scrutinize their presuppositions and promote independent, critical thinking" (p. 140). This is why one can inhabit a particular tradition and still pursue such moral religion as a way to ameliorate life.

As regards other interpretations of Ricoeur, Carter claims the value of his approach is not just that it brings "to light a hitherto unforeseen thread in Ricoeur's writings that lends his project as a whole a remarkable consistency" (p. 2), but that it also provides us a reading that "greatly enriches our understanding of his philosophical project as a whole" (p. 135). This new understanding is further said to be valuable because it offers a third way beyond attempts to appropriate Ricoeur as either simply a social-political thinker or using Christian theological terms (pp. 145-46).

Setting aside Carter's proposal for a different understanding of the nature of philosophy of religion, at least against currently regnant analytic and continental approaches, one has to ask, regarding how we understand Ricoeur, is this reading convincing, persuasive? I am not convinced. Carter does raise the important question of how to make sense of how Ricoeur stands in relation to the history of philosophy and what we are to make of his appeals both to figures within that history and to a more general understanding of what the history of Western philosophy, particularly what this meant for Ricoeur's own understanding of the nature of philosophy. Of course, as a French philosopher, he was steeped in that history and expected to teach in terms of it. And, yes, there are certain leading figures Ricoeur returns to again and again. But more methodological discussion and textual grounding would have been useful here regarding what Ricoeur himself says about when, why, and how he appeals to certain figures in the history of philosophy.

It is one thing to say that Ricoeur appeals to a past figure in order to make clearer his own point and another to say that what he says is drawn from that figure. In fact, more of the book is devoted to expositions of Spinoza, Aristotle, and Kant than to detailed examination of Ricoeur. But it is one thing to say that Ricoeur can be read, as just indicated, as using Spinoza to make a point about his own position, another to say that he grounds that position on him (p. 37). More might also have been said about why these three philosophers, not others. Hegel and Ricoeur's self-proclaimed post-Hegelian Kantianism do receive mention, but nothing is said about Ricoeur's apparently positive inclination toward Hegel in his book on Freud and his subsequent step away from Hegel in the third volume of Time and Narrative. More is at stake here than Ricoeur's rejection of Hegel's claim to absolute knowledge. It has to do, I believe, with the tie to Ricoeur's post-Hegelian Kantianism and what I would call Ricoeur's acceptance of the historicity or genealogy of our categories over against any static idea of an architectonic underlying his thought.

In a similar vein, it might be argued that Ricoeur's fascination with Jean Nabert, who is little known among Anglophone philosophers, could be given a different emphasis than that offered by Carter, who does refer to Ricoeur's citation of Nabert as a critic of Kant but overlooks, I believe, the significance of Ricoeur's many invocations of Nabert as representative of what the French call philosophie reflexive, a tradition with which Ricoeur wished to identify himself more than with that of "the strong rationalist thread" Carter sees "running through Spinoza, Aristotle, and Kant" (p. 17).

A second hesitation for me in accepting Carter's reading has to do with what he admits is a "thin" concept of religion (p. 154; cf. p.14), albeit one that "offers a timely framework for a universal religion of reason which is based on a bold reverence for life" (p. 134). I do not see what the term religion adds here -- or really where it comes from. It is as though we can move from the claim that there is some basic conviction operative in carrying out our basic human capacities, shared by all human beings because they are alive (p. 19), hence something so-to-speak "universal" that "binds" us together, to the claim that we are justified in saying that this operative conviction is, or ought to be thought of as "religion." Beyond the fact that this is, at best, a "what" statement -- what "religion" is, what it does -- that says nothing about how or why such religion operates, the warrant for such an assertion seems simply to be etymological in that Carter cites the Latin religare in a footnote on the same page. But this etymology is controversial. As the historian of religion Jonathan Z. Smith pointed out some years ago, this derivation is suspect.[1] In any case, the term is more one imposed upon what we call religions, then one they historically applied to themselves, which is why religion scholars regularly reopen the question just what it is they study. There may be a philosophy of religion, in some sense, in Ricoeur or one derivable from what he says, for example, about religious discourse in terms of his philosophy of language, but this is not to say that his philosophy is or is meant to be a religion.

Nor is it evident what is gained by calling it a moral religion. Perhaps the idea is that in dealing with Ricoeur's supposed architectonic we find something like a principle or rule that generates the framework for his understanding of ethics as summed up in the idea of a good life lived with and for others in just institutions, as he articulates this in Oneself as Another. As Carter puts it at one point, Ricoeur is committed to a "fundamental capability" to attest "to a fundamental human goodness" and "this fundamental capability implies that the human subject remains forever capable of recovering the original goodness which is obscured, but never completely destroyed, by evil and wrongdoing" (p. 59). Unfortunately, Carter never tells us where Ricoeur says this. He simply associates it with what he sees as Ricoeur's Kantianism (p. 75). Or as he puts it more cautiously: "The critical question is to what extent Ricoeur appropriates Kant in his own moral religion. At the very least, Kant's account of the human predisposition to good supports Ricoeur's claim to an original goodness or fundamental capability" (p. 76; my emphasis).

The argument here, such as it is, depends on how one interprets Ricoeur's appeal to and interpretation of Kant's last book on religion. Carter reads Ricoeur as being basically in agreement with Kant's emphasis on moral autonomy and, despite the human propensity to evil acknowledged in that book, the always available possibility of moral regeneration. I think this is to misread Ricoeur's fascination with this work by Kant. He turns to it not because he agrees with everything Kant says there, but because it is the one philosophical work that takes the fact of the existence of evil seriously as a problem, one whose explanation lies beyond human reason. The most reason can say is that the origin of evil is inscrutable, but, somehow, hope is still possible. To see why this is not sufficient for Ricoeur one would need to return to his discussion of the gap between the possibility of evil in Fallible Man and its reality in The Symbolism of Evil, as well as his essay "Evil, a Challenge to Philosophy and Theology," for which there is not space here.[2]

The larger issue, though, is to what extent philosophy can make sense of religion in what it says about the origin and end of evil and how it may do so, particularly if one is willing to move beyond the limits of Kant's philosophy. This requires what Ricoeur calls a philosophy (not a "religion") that takes seriously the fullness of language, including poetic and mythical-symbolic language. This, in turn, requires a critique of what Kant says in his book on religion and also in his moral theory, in particular with regard to the emphasis on moral autonomy, which Ricoeur sees as one of the basic claims of modernity. This is evident from two texts by Ricoeur that Carter does not discuss, one of which he cannot be expected to have seen. The first is titled "Theonomy and/or Autonomy." In it, Ricoeur argues for a dialectic of autonomy and heteronomy wherein autonomy is "if not positively compatible with heteronomy . . . at any rate not antagonistic to it" (p. 284).[3] The second, unpublished, is a lecture given in 1987 at the University of Chicago titled "Beyond Autonomy and Heteronomy." This text is important because in it Ricoeur explicitly states that he will "identify the point where I differ from a Kantian interpretation of the relation between morality and religion." This is that the religion phenomenon as such is hyper-moral, based on what Ricoeur calls "the economy of the gift" that reinterprets without eliminating the morality that is summed up in the Golden Rule.

In a word, whatever it is that Ricoeur thinks philosophy may say about morality and religion, he never identifies them.

[1] Johnathan Z. Smith, "Sacred Persistence: Towards a Redescription of Canon," in William Scott Green, ed. Approaches to Ancient Judaism: Theory and Practice, Brown Judaic Studies 1 (Missoula: Scholars Press, 1978), 13, and 27n7.

[2] In Paul Ricoeur, Figuring the Sacred: Religion, Narrative, and Imagination (Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 1995), 249-61.

[3] Paul Ricoeur, "Theonomy and/or Autonomy," trans. Robert R. Barr, in Miroslov Volf, Carmen Krieg, and Thomas Kucharz, eds., The Future of Theology: Essays in Honor of Jürgen Moltmann (Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1996), 284-98; "Théonomie et/ou Autonomie," Archivio di Filosofia 62 (1994): 19-36.