Righting Epistemology: Hume's Revolution

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Bredo Johnsen, Righting Epistemology: Hume's Revolution, Oxford University Press, 2017, 320pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190662776.

Reviewed by Jared Bates, Hanover College


Recent epistemology has lost its way, gone terribly wrong and needs to be righted. Much the same holds for scholarship on the history of epistemology. These two themes run through this volume. Johnsen's central argument is that Hume advanced a positive (anti-skeptical) response to the problem of radical skepticism about the external world that contained core elements of the theory of epistemic justification developed by Quine two centuries later. There is urgency to this project: "Quine's epistemology is the culmination of the Humean revolution, and the crowning achievement to date not only of the empiricist tradition, but of epistemology itself. Yet incredibly, it threatens to vanish, due to deep and widespread misunderstandings of it" (145).

The majority of the book deals with the history of external world skepticism. Of the book's twelve chapters, ten examine historical figures -- one on Sextus Empiricus, two on Descartes, two on Hume, one each on Popper and Goodman, two on Quine, and a final chapter on Wittgenstein. Two relatively brief chapters concern "Mainstream Epistemology" (11pp) and "Reflective Equilibrium Theory" (6pp); meanwhile, Putnam's brain-in-a-vat argument and Dretske's contextualism are treated in separate appendices at the end of the book.

Johnsen is a shrewd and unapologetic critic of many of the standard interpretations of these historical figures' work on skepticism and induction. He identifies misreadings and misunderstandings that are by turns "astonishing," "utterly baffling," "preposterous," "grievous," "willful," and "scandalous," to sample only a few of his characterizations. And these philosophers are not themselves spared such blunt treatment: Popper "badly misunderstood Hume" (93), and misinterpretations of Quine's "Epistemology Naturalized" are partly explainable by Quine's own "disastrous failure" to explain his views clearly enough to obviate them (131). Such spirited wrangling with mainstream commentary is interwoven with Johnsen's own alternative interpretations of these philosophers' work on skepticism and induction. His analyses are often masterfully laid out -- carefully measured and drawn from a breadth of relevant primary sources. His exposition and defense of Quine's epistemology is probably the most successful example on display here. In particular, Johnsen carefully disentangles Quine's perplexing use of 'evidence' to refer to (i) stimulations of sensory organs, (ii) experiences and (iii) observation statements. Additionally, I know of no interpretation and defense of the internal and pragmatic cogency of Pyrrhonian skepticism as sympathetic as Johnsen's first chapter on Sextus. Those interested in the history of epistemology in general, and of empiricism in particular, will likely find this book rewarding. Even if they are ultimately unconvinced by Johnsen's more unorthodox interpretations, their understanding of the central claims and arguments in this area will be enriched by Johnsen's provocative and subversive investigation.

What of contemporary epistemology? Even as Quine was expounding his account of empirical inference, other epistemologists were beginning work on a seemingly unrelated project, and this project came to dominate epistemology in the last half-century or so: the attempt to specify conditions for knowledge that are individually necessary and jointly Gettier-proof. According to Johnsen, these efforts have resulted in theories that render knowledge wholly unimportant. He targets virtue epistemology, but process reliabilism, coherentism and others fall to the same objection:

two individuals who flawlessly exercise their optimal [but fallible] epistemic virtues may arrive at incompatible beliefs. Suppose, then, that Tamara and Dane have arrived by such ideal processes at their respective conclusions that p and not-p. On virtue theory, the one who rightly believes her conclusion to be true also knows it to be true, while the other has had a bit of bad luck. Of what use is this information to anyone? None. Of what interest is it? None. (90)

Why is this information useless and uninteresting? Because neither Tamara nor Dane nor any virtue epistemologist knows who's got the goods. Which one knows and which one fails to know is not something we can use the theory of knowledge to find out. I want to return to this point shortly, but first let's be clear that, as Johnsen describes it, one of these two has a true belief, and the other a false belief. Surely that matters. If Tamara believes that route 62 leads to Larissa and Dane believes that route 26 leads to Larissa and only one of them is right, it's going to matter. If both set out for Larissa guided by their beliefs, only one will be successful. There may be no knowing who knows at the outset, but later we'll know who knew.

Johnsen isn't questioning the value of truth here, but rather the value of meeting the conditions on knowledge specified by epistemological theories post-Gettier. He appears to think the problem stems from fallibilism about knowledge (90n8). (To be clear: Johnsen has no problem with fallibilist conceptions of epistemic justification per se, just fallibilist conceptions of knowledge.) But the problem is at least as much a result of current theories denying the KK principle (i.e., denying the principle that knowing implies knowing that one knows). Denying the KK principle is certainly associated with fallibilism, but is independently plausible. For instance, anyone who would attribute knowledge to individuals who do not make the requisite higher-order judgments -- like young children or nonhuman animals -- would deny that knowing implies knowing that one knows. But whether it's down to fallibilism or the denial of the KK principle, Tamara and Dane can't tell -- in the moment -- which of them knows. It is hard not to agree with Johnsen's basic complaint about this predicament. And many do agree. The criticism here bears a close affinity to some of the arguments on the value of knowledge presented by Williamson (2000), Kvanvig (2003) and others.

The upshot of Johnsen's analysis of contemporary epistemology is that epistemology should focus on the theory of epistemic justification, not the theory of knowledge (91). And the theory of epistemic justification he favors is the one he finds running through Hume, Popper, Goodman and Quine. He calls it Reflective Equilibrium Theory. I'm afraid this name invites confusion, so two brief comments are in order.

First, Johnsen is presenting Reflective Equilibrium Theory as a first-order theory of epistemic justification, not as a meta-epistemological principle. This bears pointing out since most readers are likely more familiar with reflective equilibrium as meta-epistemology. Rawls (1971, 20) gave the methodology its name, but explicitly borrowed it from Goodman's (1955, 65-68) justification of rules of inductive and deductive inference. Goldman (1986, 66), drawing on Goodman's and Rawls' use of the method, uses reflective equilibrium to arrive at his process-reliabilist account of epistemic justification. Although there's more to it than this, the basic method here aims to reach a state of agreement (equilibrium) between general principles, on the one hand, and judgments (intuitions) about particular cases of justified and unjustified belief, on the other. The particular cases are usually featured in thought experiments. Arguably, although they are not always as explicit as Goldman, most analytic epistemologists are employing the method of reflective equilibrium to reach their theories of epistemic justification. Johnsen does not weigh in on reflective equilibrium as a meta-epistemological principle.

Second, recall that Johnsen's Reflective Equilibrium Theory is his statement of a theory of epistemic justification he finds implicit in Quine's writings. Despite his worry that it is verging on disappearing, this theory has been ably articulated and defended by Lycan (1988) as explanationism and by Harman (1965, 1973, 1986) as inference to the best explanation. Lycan (1996, 1) traces the view to Goodman, Quine and Sellars, while Harman (1973, viii) acknowledges a debt to Quine. Despite their shared Quinean influences, Johnsen acknowledges neither Lycan's nor Harman's work on explanationism about epistemic justification. Readers familiar with Lycan's and Harman's work will not miss the connection, though it will only become clear in the middle third of the book.

What, then, is Reflective Equilibrium Theory? Johnsen spends about seventy pages formulating and reformulating the theory in his survey of Goodman and Quine, culminating in this concise statement:

The process of justification is the delicate one of maximizing overall fitness and minimizing the sacrifice of independent credibility in a consistent and empirically significant body of beliefs about how things are and how they appear to be; in the satisfaction of these aims lies the only justification needed for any belief belonging to it. (192)

We hear the unmistakable echo of Goodman on justifying deduction: "The process of justification is the delicate one of making mutual adjustments between rules and accepted inferences; and in the agreement achieved lies the only justification needed for either" (1955, 67). Taken out of context, however, the concise statement of Reflective Equilibrium Theory isn't particularly helpful, so I will highlight three important features of it. First, "maximizing overall fitness and minimizing the sacrifice of independent credibility" crucially involve appeal to such canonical principles of theory-preference as testability, explanatory scope, parsimony, conservativeness and others, criteria used in evaluating explanations. Second, one's "body of beliefs" is treated as a whole due to Quine's refusal to draw a distinction between theoretical statements, on the one hand, and factual judgments, on the other; for Quine, factual judgments are theoretical since they posit theoretical entities (e.g., physical objects). Finally, the theory neither references concepts like knowledge, truth or probability nor attempts to analyze those concepts. Johnsen's Reflective Equilibrium Theory preserves the thoroughly Humean-Quinean point that there is no rational basis for thinking our scientific theories probable.

Hume's repeated claim that no "process of reasoning" establishes even the probability of inductive conclusions has led many to think that his official position on the justification of induction is that such inferences are never justified (Johnsen, 76-77). Johnsen demurs. Not only does he think Hume distinguishes between justified and unjustified inductive inferences (for instance, Hume praises Newton's justification of his physical theory), he thinks Hume at the very least suggests an account of the distinction, that is, a theory of inductive justification. And that theory is Reflective Equilibrium Theory. The textual evidence is meager. Johnsen lists three brief passages from the Treatise and the Enquiry (78), the most suggestive of which is from the Enquiry, Section IV, Part I. To these I would add a fourth:

For to me it seems evident, that the essence of the mind being equally unknown to us with that of external bodies, it must be equally impossible to form any notion of its powers and qualities otherwise than from careful and exact experiments, and the observation of those particular effects, which result from its different circumstances and situations. And tho' we must endeavor to render all our principles as universal as possible, by tracing up our experiments to the utmost, and explaining all effects from the simplest and fewest causes, 'tis still certain we cannot go beyond experience; and any hypothesis, that pretends to discover the ultimate original qualities of human nature, ought at first to be rejected as presumptuous and chimerical. (Treatise, Introduction, paragraph 8, my emphasis)

It is well known that empiricists like Hume hold that we can never pull back the veil of perception, and consequently can never establish conclusions about the external world we can know to be true, or even probable. But here Hume advances a positive norm for epistemology: "we must endeavor" to arrive at explanations that satisfy as far as possible the twin demands of empirical adequacy ("explaining all [observed] effects") and theoretical unity ("from the simplest and fewest causes" and "principles as universal as possible"). This looks like inference to the best explanation to me. Although we may wish Hume had elaborated on his positive view of inductive inference, or at the very least dropped a few more references to it, Johnsen provides convincing evidence that he actually had such a positive view, and, moreover, that the view is an ancestor of twentieth-century explanationism. Again, I take this to be the central argument of Righting Epistemology, and I think it is both important and successful.

It is difficult to infer from this result that contemporary epistemology is in disarray, or that "knowledge is simply of no epistemological interest on any extant conception of it" (xi). That will depend on issues not addressed in this book, the most important of which may be the question whether empirical theorizing takes place behind the empiricist's veil of perception at all.


Goldman, Alvin I. (1986) Epistemology and cognition. (Harvard University Press).

Goodman, Nelson. (1955) Fact, fiction and forecast. (Harvard University Press).

Harman, Gilbert. (1965) "The inference to the best explanation" Philosophical Review 74: 88-95.

_____. (1973) Thought. (Princeton University Press).

_____. (1986) Change in view. (MIT Press).

Hume, David. (2000) A treatise of human nature, David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton, eds. (Oxford University Press).

Kvanvig, Jonathan L. (2003) The value of knowledge and the pursuit of understanding. (Cambridge University Press).

Lycan, William G. (1988) Judgment and justification. (Cambridge University Press).

_____. (1996) "Plantinga and coherentisms" in Jonathan L. Kvanvig, ed., Warrant in contemporary epistemology: essays in honor of Plantinga's theory of knowledge. (Rowman and Littlefield): 1-23.

Rawls, John. (1971) A theory of justice. (Harvard University Press).

Williamson, Timothy. (2000) Knowledge and its limits. (Oxford University Press).