Rights Forfeiture and Punishment

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Christopher Heath Wellman, Rights Forfeiture and Punishment, Oxford University Press, 2017, 228pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190274764.

Reviewed by David Dolinko, University of California, Los Angeles


Convicted criminals are punished by "hard treatment" -- restrictions and deprivations that would ordinarily be viewed as flagrant moral wrongs, such as loss of property, of liberty, and even of life. Scholars have fought for centuries over what makes such punishment morally permissible, if indeed it is. Christopher Heath Wellman addresses this perennial problem of the "justification of punishment" and contends that the vast majority of proposed answers have been fundamentally misconceived.

Those answers traditionally take punishment to be morally legitimated by the crucial importance of the purposes it serves, such as deterrence, retribution, rehabilitation, and reprobation. Wellman, however, asserts that neither these nor any other purposes can make punishment morally acceptable. Describing the intended goals of punishment does not establish the permissibility of the methods it employs.

Wellman advocates shifting our focus from the aims of punishment to the rights that "hard treatment" would normally violate. Why does such treatment not violate the rights of wrongdoers? Wellman's answer is his "rights forfeiture theory of punishment": those who wrongfully violate the rights of other people forfeit their own rights against hard treatment. This theory purports to explain what permits us to punish offenders while leaving open the reasons for doing so.

The rights forfeiture theory has had other champions (as well as foes) in recent years, but Wellman is its most prominent and persistent exponent. His book cogently sets out and develops defenses of the theory that he has described in a number of recent publications, and explores its implications for such related topics as the existence of procedural rights, the moral credentials of mala prohibita offenses, and the theoretical basis of international criminal law. Wellman examines many objections to the forfeiture theory and counters them with arguments presented in a clear and lucid style and illustrated by ingenious hypotheticals. The limited space available permits only a glance at some aspects of his theory and some of the problems it faces.

Wellman bases his theory on a number of principles appearing throughout the book, which will be summarized briefly here. Ordinarily, one enjoys rights against the kinds of hard treatment that punishment involves. We may refer to these rights collectively as one's "right against punishment." That right is forfeited, however, if (and only if) one violates (or attempts to violate) another person's rights.1 It is forfeited to an extent proportionate to one's wrongdoing. Offenders may therefore be subjected to (proportionate) punishment without violating their rights. Indeed, forfeiture of one's right against punishment is sufficient, not merely necessary, for punishment to be morally permissible (4-5).

The moral evaluation of an agent must be sharply distinguished from the moral evaluation of her action. A positive evaluation of one does not imply a positive evaluation of the other. The evaluation of agents is "subjective," depending largely on the agent's reasons for acting (including desires, beliefs, intentions, and the like). Moral evaluation of an action, on the other hand, depends only on "objective" factors such as whether it infringed or violated someone's rights -- a principle Wellman calls "objectivism about obligations."2 Finally, "the right to punish is competitive; in other words, anyone (i.e., not only the person whose right was violated) may permissibly punish a wrongdoer" (6).

The claim that wrongdoers forfeit their right against punishment is central to the rights forfeiture theory, and a crucial question is why this forfeiture occurs. The biggest flaw in Wellman's theory is the lack of a satisfactory explanation. Wellman admits that he cannot add anything to the accounts offered by previous exponents of the theory, which did not satisfy skeptics. But because "[a]ll arguments have to start somewhere" (25), and because he believes that the forfeiture claim has strong intuitive appeal, he simply assumes as his starting point that the claim is true.

That assumption, however, begs the question that the forfeiture theory is supposed to answer. The question is why punishing a wrongdoer does not violate the wrongdoer's rights. Wellman's answer is that wrongdoers lose (by forfeit) the rights that their punishment would otherwise violate. To assume that such a forfeiture occurs is to resolve the clash between punishment and the wrongdoer's rights by simply postulating that those rights have vanished.3

Wellman deals crisply and efficiently, however, with several other standard objections to the forfeiture theory. He denies, for example, that it mandates barbaric punishments for barbaric crimes by emphasizing that offenders need not forfeit the very same rights they violated. To the objection that forfeiture of rights would permit anyone, including private vigilantes, to punish wrongdoers, Wellman responds that this is not problematic: it means only that the theory is neutral, as it should be, between anarchism and statism. Later, drawing on principles of political philosophy outside the forfeiture theory itself, Wellman adds an argument that vigilantism is impermissible in states that satisfy certain criteria of legitimacy.

Wellman's "strong" brand of forfeiture theory treats forfeiture of rights as not only necessary but also sufficient to make punishment permissible. Wouldn't that make it permissible to punish those who forfeit their rights even if no good whatsoever would result, but only satisfaction of the punisher's sadistic desires? Yes, Wellman concedes, but this applies only to punishment by an individual. State punishment, he contends, is justified only if it serves very important functions. Moreover, the permissibility of pointless punishment by individuals does not exempt those individuals from moral reprobation. Recall Wellman's principle that moral evaluation of an agent is independent of the evaluation of her action. Hence a sadistic agent can be condemned as morally despicable even if her gratuitously punishing a wrongdoer is a morally permissible act.4

Wellman has no ready response, however, to "the problem of relatedness," which is "the concern that the forfeiture theory of punishment implies that people might permissibly harm wrongdoers for reasons totally unrelated to their wrongdoing" (129). Suppose, for example, that Lucretia commits a crime and thereby forfeits her right against one year of imprisonment,5 but that no one suspects her of this crime. For unrelated reasons, however, the authorities make her a scapegoat, using falsified evidence to convict her of a crime she did not commit. If she is sentenced to imprisonment for one year, are her rights violated? Yes, according to the "related-reasons" version of forfeiture theory. But the "unrelated-reasons" version implies that imprisoning Lucretia for a year is morally permissible even if done for reasons wholly unrelated to her actual wrongdoing.

Wellman's struggle with this problem, which occupies an entire chapter, reflects an admirable effort to do justice to all the relevant, competing considerations. Though he ultimately rejects the "unlimited-reasons" view, he does not dismiss it out of hand. It is supported by the principle of "objectivism about obligation" described earlier: the wrongful motivation of those who punish Lucretia should not make their punishing her impermissible.

The unlimited-reasons view gains additional support from a thought experiment about several would-be assassins of Hitler. Wellman argues that each of them, if successful, would have acted permissibly, although they act for motives that differ greatly in moral worth. I think that making Hitler the assassins' target weakens the thought experiment, however, because Hitler's role in perpetrating unique and monstrous evils virtually guarantees that killing him would be permissible no matter what motivates the killer.

When Wellman considers examples in which wrongdoers less abhorrent than Hitler are killed, the results challenge the unlimited-reasons view rather than supporting it. In particular, he imagines a state of nature in which a thug ("Butch") enjoys slitting the throats of randomly selected victims.6 Unbeknownst to Butch, his latest victim was herself a killer whose atrocious crimes had forfeited her right to life. The unlimited-reasons view would treat Butch as acting permissibly when he slits her throat, but Wellman finds that conclusion unacceptable.

He suggests instead that something distinctive about punishment may require that it be imposed only for the right reasons, and tests that suggestion with several more hypotheticals. These, he argues, reveal that a wrongdoer who receives hard treatment acquires a right against additional punishment only if the initial hardships were imposed for reasons related to the wrongdoing. And that, in turn, implies that "wrongdoers forfeit their rights only against punishment, not hard treatment more broadly" (143).

Besides defending the forfeiture theory as a justification of punishment, Wellman explores its implications for issues ranging from the existence of moral procedural rights and the proper conception of international criminal law to the overall moral status of the American criminal justice system. As an example, consider his account of the tort/crime distinction and the moral propriety of "mala prohibita" crimes.

Traditionally, tort law has been said to concern itself with private harms and criminal law with public harms. Wellman gives reasons for rejecting that account of the distinction, the most basic being the difficulty of understanding why the community as a whole is harmed by every crime against one of its members. A better account, he believes, is latent in the forfeiture theory's stipulation that "you may permissibly be punished only if you forfeit your right against this hard treatment" and that "you forfeit this right only if you violate someone else's right" (174, emphasis added).7 Those who infringe rights without violating them "do not forfeit their rights against being punished," and though they "may permissibly be forced to make their victims whole," "only rights violators may permissibly be punished" (70). Thus, the distinction between tort and criminal law "does not rest on a public/private distinction" but rather "maps onto the difference between rights infringements and rights violations" (70).

This way of drawing the civil/criminal distinction creates problems of its own, which Wellman conscientiously discusses. Why, for example, are private wrongs and de minimis infractions not punished criminally? Why does the state have exclusive control over criminal proceedings even though private individuals decide whether or not to initiate tort suits? Wellman suggests ways to answer these questions. He has more difficulty reconciling his claim that only rights violators may be punished with the existence of crimes that violate no individual rights, such as public intoxication, possession of burglar tools, espionage, illegal gambling, and consensual incest between adult siblings.

The issue, for Wellman, is whether the forfeiture theory can accommodate "mala prohibita" crimes -- those wrongful only because legally prohibited, as opposed to inherently evil actions such as rape and murder. Statutory rape and driving without a valid registration sticker are his chief examples. Such crimes are problematic because "it is not obvious whose right the criminal violates" (149). (The same is true of some crimes that are not mala prohibita, such as espionage and brother-sister incest, but Wellman appears to overlook them.)

Wellman devotes an entire chapter to mala prohibita crimes and concludes that they are not per se incompatible with the forfeiture theory (though many of them, like statutory rape, will require revision to avoid unjust application). He reaches that conclusion by arguing that mala prohibita offenders do actually violate the rights of other people. Legitimate states, he says, "perform an incredibly important function" by "rescuing all of us from the perils of the state of nature," and "each of us has a duty to obey the law as her fair share of this larger communal project" (155). Each of us owes this duty to all our fellow citizens, so that each of those citizens has a right that we obey the law. One who disobeys even a malum prohibitum law therefore violates a right of each of her fellows and may legitimately be punished.

Is this argument sound? Its conclusion that I have a right that you wear your seat belt and display a valid registration sticker on your car seems unnatural and artificial. Moreover, if mala prohibita crimes all violate the same right (one's right that others obey the law), they should all receive the same punishment. Yet punishing statutory rape and lack of a registration sticker equally seems absurd. Though aware of the problem (165), Wellman appears to have no solution to propose.

Wellman discusses many more facets of many more issues than there is room to examine here. I hope to have provided enough examples to illustrate the care and thoroughness of his exposition and exploration of the forfeiture theory. The book offers a sophisticated presentation of that theory which covers a lot of ground and should be of value to anyone interested in that approach to the justification of criminal punishment.

1  Wellman writes on page 6 that "one does not forfeit a right unless one culpably violates (or at least attempts to violate) someone else's right. One necessarily loses one's moral immunity to (proportionate) punishment whenever one culpably violates a moral right."

2 "[A]n agent's reasons for acting do not determine the deontic status of her action" (120). Moreover, Wellman says that he takes "an agent's moral culpability" to "be a subjective matter," but regards "the rights she violates" as "an objective matter" (106).

3 "When asked why punishment is justified, defenders of forfeiture theory say: because the criminal has forfeited his rights. But no account is forthcoming of why the criminal loses his rights . . . As a result, it appears that saying the criminal forfeits his rights is saying nothing more than that punishing is justified." Simmons, "Locke and the Right to Punish," Philosophy and Public Affairs 20: (1991): 334.

4 I think a problem remains, however, as Wellman's subsequent discussion of imagined assassins of Hitler suggests. Because Hitler has forfeited his right to life, Wellman infers that "neither he nor anyone else has any grounds to object" to his assassination (125), and no third party is justified in preventing the assassination even if the would-be killer's "motivation and character are thoroughly reprehensible" (126). Apply this reasoning to John, who has forfeited his right against punishment and whom Mary seeks to punish for her own sadistic pleasure even though no good whatsoever will result. By Wellman's reasoning, neither John nor anyone else has "grounds to object," and no third party may prevent Mary from carrying out her plan. Those conclusions seem hard to accept. And how meaningful is the ability to condemn Mary morally, which forfeiture theory leaves us, if we may not interfere with her action?

5 Wellman believes that "a wrongdoer forfeits her right against a fitting or proportionate punishment" (34).

6 Butch first appeared in John Simmons, "Locke and the Right to Punish," Philosophy and Public Affairs 20 (1991): 311-349.

7 Actually, Wellman concedes that one also forfeits one's right against punishment by attempting to violate another person's rights. This refinement need not explicitly be mentioned in what follows. For convenience, I will use "violates rights" to mean "violates or attempts to violate rights."