Robust Ethics: The Metaphysics and Epistemology of Godless Normative Realism

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Erik J. Weilenberg, Robust Ethics: The Metaphysics and Epistemology of Godless Normative Realism, Oxford University Press, 2014, 196pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198714323.

Reviewed by Terence Cuneo, University of Vermont


Twenty-five years ago, no one would've predicted that "robust" or nonnaturalist realism would become the most lively research program in metaethics. But so it is, and Erik Wielenberg's new book is testament to this research program's continued vitality.

Two characteristics distinguish Wielenberg's book from other recent defenses of robust realism. First, Wielenberg takes not just naturalistic but also theistic alternatives to robust realism seriously, arguing that non-theistic robust realism "is at least as plausible" as theistic versions of moral realism (x). Second, Wielenberg engages extensively with recent work in empirical psychology, arguing that, far from posing skeptical challenges to robust realism, this work fits comfortably with an approach to moral knowledge that robust realists embrace. In both these (and other) respects, Robust Realism is a welcome contribution to metaethics. As someone who follows work in experimental philosophy at a distance, I found Wielenberg's engagement with this literature fruitful, since he is very good at identifying suspect assumptions and inferences made by those working in this field. As someone attracted to both robust realism and theism, I found working through Wielenberg's argument that theistic realism has no genuine advantages over (non-theistic) robust realism instructive, albeit less satisfying than the rest of the book. At the end of this review, I explain why.

The book has no aspirations to be a comprehensive defense of robust realism. Rather, it is a selective engagement with various challenges to robust realism that constitutes an "indirect defense" of the view (14). This indirect defense divides into four parts.

In the first part, Wielenberg lays out some of robust realism's metaphysical commitments, taking on the challenge that it is unable to explain the supervenience of the moral on the non-moral. As he understands the challenge, realists must explain why sets of moral properties must co-vary with non-moral ones in such a way that it is impossible for there to be any change in a thing's moral properties without a change in its non-moral properties. Wielenberg contends that realists should explain why this modal relation holds by appealing to the making (or grounding) relation, which he holds to be brute. This relation, he further suggests, can be understood as a robust causal relation analogous to the relation that God is said to bear to the created world when God conserves the created world in existence (20).

Wielenberg does not address the concern that understanding the making relation by appeal to divine conservation threatens to explain the obscure in terms of the more obscure. But he is sensitive to the charge that positing a brute making relation between distinct properties represents no advance in the dialectic between robust realism and its critics. This charge, he contends, can be met.

Suppose the making relation were brute, as Wielenberg does. He argues that if it were, this would not be a reason to believe that no such relation binds the non-moral to the moral, since every view must countenance brute relations. Suppose, in addition, the making relation were to obtain between distinct properties, as Wielenberg does. He contends that this would also not be a reason to hold that no such relation explains the supervenience of the moral on the non-moral, since critics of robust realism also seem to commit themselves to the same relation.

Wielenberg's argument for this last claim consists in noting that there is a methodological principle to which critics of robust realism appeal. According to this principle:

(A) If a theory countenances a brute making relation between distinct properties, then that is a reason to reject that theory.

(A) appears to make essential reference to distinct properties, namely, being a brute making relation between distinct properties and being a reason to reject a theory. Moreover, it appears as if a theory's having the first property determines its having the latter. If these appearances are veridical, the charge that robust realism is theoretically suspect because it countenances a brute making relation between distinct properties is self-undermining: the principle employed to make this case, namely, (A), appears to commit itself to the existence of the selfsame relation between distinct properties.

The second part of Wielenberg's book replies to theistic critics of non-theistic robust realism, such as William Lane Craig and Robert M. Adams. In various places, Craig charges that non-theistic views cannot explain why: (i) anything is good or bad; (ii) human lives are meaningful; (iii) moral obligations and rights exist; (iv) we would have reason to care about satisfying moral requirements if they were to exist; and (v) we would be motivated to act morally. Wielenberg contends that none of these charges stick. In an effort to push back against these views, he argues that versions of the divine command theory such as Adams's cannot explain why reasonable non-believers are subject to moral obligations. The basic worry is that Adams holds that in order for a command to generate an obligation in an addressee, that addressee must recognize that command as emanating from a legitimate authority. But reasonable non-believers recognize no such thing. So, if moral obligations were generated by divine commands, then these agents would not be subject to such obligations. This is a consequence that no divine command theorist would find acceptable.

The book's third part begins by introducing the distinction between "fast" and "slow" cognition -- the former consisting in the operation of "System 1" cognitive systems, the latter consisting in the operation of "System 2" cognitive systems. Much empirical research focuses on the fact that when a belief is the upshot of the workings of System 1, agents often find themselves unable to accurately identify what led them to form that belief, and they often flail for answers. Despite such "dumbfounding," some psychologists accept the hypothesis that our conscious moral judgments often conform to general moral principles that are hidden from the agent in the sense that the agent cannot become aware of them merely by reflection. (In this regard, there is supposed to be a direct parallel with our knowledge of some of the norms of grammar.) Wielenberg fashions a broadly reliabilist position that hypothesizes that System 1 cognition could account for justified moral beliefs to the extent that its outputs reliably represent and conform to these hidden principles. Under this approach, System 1 cognition would be among the mechanisms or cognitive processes that yield justified moral belief. With this model in hand, he turns to recent discussions in experimental philosophy of the roles of disgust, emotion, and rationalization in moral judgment. The overall conclusion that Wielenberg reaches is that, while these elements complicate our understanding of moral cognition, there is no reason to hold that appeal to them supports a version of moral skepticism. Drawing upon a range of empirical work, he contends that disgust, for example, needn't be a distorting factor in moral judgment. For, if our best empirical work is to be trusted, our tendencies to feel disgust are malleable, and can also be directly influenced by and responsive to changes in our moral beliefs.

The book's final part is a wide-ranging discussion of the so-called evolutionary debunking argument as it is developed by critics of realism such as Michael Ruse, Richard Joyce, and Sharon Street. Under one prominent interpretation, this type of argument challenges realists to explain how our moral judgments could be reliably correlated with the moral facts, given evolution's pervasive influence on our moral belief-forming dispositions. Wielenberg's favored approach is a "third factor" view, which states that there is no need for realists to maintain that evolution has equipped us with dispositions specially geared toward tracking moral reality. Rather, Wielenberg's idea is that evolution has endowed us with cognitive faculties that both ground the possession of moral rights and "generate moral beliefs, including the relevant beliefs about rights" (145). These cognitive faculties, then, "explain the correlation between moral rights and beliefs about these rights" (145). He further maintains that his favored third-factor view and his account of justified moral beliefs as produced by System 1 moral cognition are compatible with moral properties being causally inert (xi). Many view robust realism's commitment to the causal inefficacy of moral properties to be one of its greatest liabilities. So, if Wielenberg's proposal regarding how we acquire justified moral belief were compatible with this commitment, this would be important. His treatment of this issue is suggestive but brief (see p. 105 in particular).

As this summary will have made evident, Robust Ethics tackles some long-standing and fascinating problems in metaethics by making some novel moves and venturing into some relatively uncharted territory. For these reasons, it is a book well worth reading. As I indicated at the outset of this review, however, I was unsatisfied with its treatment of theistic versions of moral realism. Let me close by voicing some reservations about this portion of the book.

When I read the most sophisticated discussions of God and morality in the work of thinkers such as Adams, Nicholas Wolterstorff, C. Stephen Layman, Mark Murphy, Linda Zagzebski, and John Hare, I find that none of them maintains that there could (in the relevant epistemic sense of "could") be no meaningful lives, value, obligations, or reasons to be moral if God were not to exist.[1] Rather, they claim that theistic views have some advantages over non-theistic views because they can better accommodate and explain certain data than these non-theistic views. I found myself, then, puzzled by Wielenberg's choice to engage extensively and almost exclusively with a very radical theistic view that states that there could be no meaningful lives, value, obligations, or reasons to be moral if God were not to exist. (Admittedly, this radical view is often voiced by lay people and defended in works of Christian apologetics. But, as best I can tell, these are not the audiences to which Robust Ethics is addressed.) Moreover, when Wielenberg does discuss some of the crucial issues that divide non-theistic from plausible theistic views, the discussion is very brief.

For example, Wielenberg dedicates only a paragraph to assessing the thesis -- to which theists sometimes appeal -- that:

(B) Morality and self-interest never diverge in the long run. (59)

He contends that, when attempting to vindicate this claim, theists either must appeal to the existence of God to affirm it, which would render any argument for theistic moral realism question-begging, or provide a secular rationale for it, which (to the extent that it is successful) would undermine the case for theistic moral realism. He notes that philosophers such as Craig take (B) to be a datum that any satisfactory metaethical theory must accommodate. However, "such an approach," Wielenberg writes, "has nothing to commend it" (59).

I have several reservations about this dismissal of (B). First, I doubt that (B) is the thesis that should be under consideration. Instead, I would think that the more general claim that:

(C) Moral reasons are authoritative, trumping even those of self-interest when reasons of both sorts conflict,

is the one that Wielenberg needs to consider. (C) is hardly uncontroversial. Still, numerous philosophers who do not accept theism -- including, most prominently, Christine Korsgaard -- have claimed that a satisfactory metaethical theory should vindicate it. For, if a view could vindicate (C), it would allow us to make sense of the common conviction that morality is not just one normative system among others but demands our unqualified allegiance.

Friends of theistic moral realism contend that their position can vindicate (C). In their view, not only could reasons of self-interest not ultimately diverge from those provided by moral demands (at least for the virtuous), acting immorally would also put one at variance with the Good, namely, God. Theistic moral realists sometimes develop this last point by making the following assumptions: (i) values such as goodness determine (or perhaps consist in there being) reasons; (ii) when values determine reasons, the normative weight of these reasons is determined by the type and degree of these values: roughly, the greater the value, the weightier the reasons it generates; (iii) God is of inestimable value, this value having aesthetic, moral, and difficult-to-characterize normative dimensions, such as holiness; and (iv) acting immorally is to be inappropriately related to God. Grant these assumptions and it follows that there are decisive reasons not to act immorally.

I am not sure whether (C) is a theoretical datum that a metaethical theory must vindicate on pain of being unsatisfactory. But I am inclined to hold that vindicating (C) is a theoretical desideratum: if a theory could vindicate (C), that would speak in favor of that theory, all else being equal. It also seems to me that whether vindicating (C) is a theoretical desideratum is a matter that deserves careful consideration. For whether vindicating (C) is a theoretical desideratum is a fundamental methodological issue that often divides non-theistic from theistic views: while some secular views deny that vindicating (C) is a desideratum, no theistic view (to my knowledge) does. To which I'd add that if vindicating (C) is a desideratum, this probably does not bode well for Wielenberg's position.

To see why, consider Wielenberg's own view concerning moral reasons. According to this view, when an agent has decisive moral reason to act in some way, then that agent is morally obligated to act in that way (7; cf. 52). In one place, Wielenberg claims that "to have an obligation just is to have decisive reasons to perform a certain action" (57).

There are two ways to understand this position. According to the first -- call it the unqualified view -- a limited range of normative facts, such as moral and prudential facts, favor or justify responses of certain kinds. If this view is correct, when a moral fact favors or justifies the performance of an action, then there is a moral reason to perform that action. However, under this view, the term "moral reason" does not designate a special type of favoring relation, namely, the moral favoring relation that a moral fact bears to a response of a certain type. Rather, it designates a state of affairs in which there is a moral fact that bears the favoring relation to a given type of response (or, alternatively, it designates a moral fact that bears the favoring relation to a given type of response).

Now distinguish two variants of the unqualified view. According to the first variant, moral obligations determine moral reasons. This variant, however, cannot be the view that Wielenberg accepts, since his position is not that moral obligations determine moral reasons but that moral reasons either determine or are identical with moral obligations. According to the second variant, moral obligations just are decisive moral reasons. This variant of the view avoids the problem just stated. And it trivially implies (B). But it is not easy to understand. This view implies that the state of affairs that consists in some moral fact M decisively favoring a response is a moral obligation. But M cannot itself be a moral obligation, for no complex state of affairs could have M as a constituent and be identical with M. It is not apparent, however, what other sort of moral fact M could be.

Now consider the second understanding of Wielenberg's position. Under this position -- call it the qualified view -- the term "moral reason" designates a special type of favoring relation, namely, the moral favoring relation that something could bear to a response of a certain kind. This relation is just one of many such relations. In fact, according to this view, every system of norms generates and entails a correlative set of reasons: norms of etiquette generate etiquette reasons; norms of chess generate chess reasons; norms of the Mafia generate Mafioso reasons; norms of morality generate moral reasons, and so on.

If this view were correct, it trivially implies that if we are morally obligated to refrain from acting in a given way, then there is a moral reason for us to refrain from acting in that way. Unfortunately, this position also trivially implies that if we are "Mafioso required" to refrain from a given action, then there is a Mafioso reason to refrain from performing it. While this position might be able to explain how moral obligations are grounded in (or are identical with) moral reasons, it implies nothing regarding the normative weight of these reasons and the obligations they determine (or are identical with). Instead, it invites us to ask the higher-level question whether we have reason to act on the qualified reasons we have. As such, the qualified view of reasons goes no distance toward vindicating (C).

The conclusion I reach is that any satisfactory engagement with theistic moral realism must address the issue of whether vindicating (C) is a theoretical desideratum. It must then either explain how non-theistic views can vindicate (C) or defend the claim that failing to vindicate (C) is not a serious theoretical shortcoming. The concern I have raised is that Robust Ethics does neither.


Thanks to Tyler Doggett, Lindsay Whittaker, and Erik Wielenberg for their comments on a draft of this review.

[1] See Adams, Finite and Infinite Goods (Oxford, 1999); Wolterstorff, Justice: Rights and Wrongs (Princeton, 2008), ch. 17 and Understanding Liberal Democracy (Oxford, 2012), ch. 7; Layman, "God and the Moral Order," Faith and Philosophy 23 (2006): 3-16; Murphy, God and Moral Law (Oxford, 2011); Zagzebski, Divine Motivation Theory (Cambridge, 2004); Hare, The Moral Gap (Oxford, 1996) and Why Bother Being Good? (InterVarsity, 2002).