Robust Reality: An Essay in Formal Ontology

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George Englebretsen, Robust Reality: An Essay in Formal Ontology, Ontos, 2012, 184pp., €79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381337.

Reviewed by Nino B. Cocchiarella, Indiana University


Robust Reality is a development of Fred Sommers' tree theory account of the structure of natural language and its relation to ontology. The main thesis of the theory is that there is a structural isomorphism between language and ontology, where ontology is understood as structured by the inclusion relation between the different categories of things. Included in this account is a brief description of Sommers' term functor logic (TFL), also called mondial logic, which Englebretsen takes to be a preferred alternative to first-order logic (FOL). Whereas FOL is constructed on the basis of taking names, predicates and sentences as different types of material or descriptive expressions, TFL is based on terms as a single type of material expression, where the terms can be simple or complex and include sentences as complex terms. The really crucial difference, however, is that FOL has quantifiers and a system of quantifier logic, while TFL has neither. Instead, quantifiers, as we will see, are suppressed and become part of "logical copulae".

On Sommers' account, a sentence that expresses a proposition is made up of descriptive expressions called terms. Terms are categorematic expressions, as opposed to logical or syncategorematic words or expressions. All terms (even names and sentences), according to Englebretsen, are predicable expressions and come in pairs, positive or negative (e.g., 'P'/'nonP', 'wise'/'unwise', 'red'/'non-red', etc.). If neither P nor nonP applies to a thing, then P and nonP are said to be "impredicable" of that thing. If the charge is ignored, then∣P∣ is used to represent either 'P' or 'nonP'. A term is said to span a thing if it can be used, whether positively or negatively, to characterize that thing. Spanning, according to Englebretsen, is a matter of sense, not truth, i.e., a term spans a thing if it makes sense to predicate the term of that thing. Senses, on this account, are not the same as meanings.

According to Englebretsen a hierarchical tree can be generated for a natural language by the predicability relation that applies to the terms of that language. The predicability relation can be natural, as in 'Some men are old', or unnatural, as in 'Some old (things) are men'. Natural predication occurs only when the subject-term is lower on the language tree than the predicate-term, which mean that 'old' in this case is higher than 'men'. Terms higher on the language tree, in other words, are naturally predicable of more terms than are terms that are lower relative to them. The lowest terms will then be singular terms, e.g., proper names. Such a tree reveals the structure determined by the connections between things and their properties, a view that goes back to Aristotle. Aristotle's tree rule, for example, states that if B and C are mutually impredicable, and A is predicable of both, then A is naturally predicable of B and C, and B and C are not naturally predicable of A. Aristotle's transitivity rule, that a term A that is mutually predicable of a term B is naturally predicable of any term that B is naturally predicable of, is a corollary of this tree rule. Sommers criticized this rule because it blurs certain important distinctions between categories and types as described below, and he replaced it with his law of categorial inclusion, which states that of any two categories either they are mutually exclusive or one is included in the other.

Strictly speaking, the nodes of a language tree are not the terms of that language but the senses of those terms. Terms with more than one sense have those senses located at different nodes of the tree. The lines that connect tree nodes represent a special kind of relation between senses. The senses of a pair of terms that can be used together to form a meaningful subject-predicate sentence are said to be U-related. Pairs that cannot be used this way are said to be N-related. Sentences formed by N-related terms are said to be "category mistakes". The fact that two terms S and P are U-related is represented by U(SP); and N(SP) similarly indicates that S and P are N-related. It is noteworthy that the senses of color terms, e.g., 'red', 'yellow', 'blue', will all be located at the same node, i.e., they all have the same sense (which, again, is not to be confused with meaning).

On the ontological side, a category is the class of all things spanned by a term. Types, on the other hand, are categories that are either equivalent or mutually exclusive. Types, accordingly, are categories that never properly include one another. Given a graphic representation of a language tree, we can, according to Englebretsen, "read the symbols on the tree (e.g., ∣A∣, ∣B∣, etc.) either as absolute terms or as categories" (p. 34). Sommers' law of categorial inclusion that any two categories are either mutually exclusive or one is included in the other can be formulated as follows:

U(PQ) ≡ ((∣P∣⊆∣Q∣) ∨ (∣Q∣ ⊆ ∣P∣)).

One consequence of this law is the "tree rule" that if any term P is U-related to two N-related terms Q and R, then P is U-related to any term that is U-related to either Q or R. This tree rule, Englebretsen claims, "allows one to locate any term on a language tree" (p. 38). There is also a rule to the effect that no category is empty, a thesis that is not fully explained in this text.

In addition to sense rules, i.e., rules that express relations between terms (or the senses of terms), and the corresponding categorial rules, there are also "translation rules" that "express the isomorphism between language and ontology" (p. 41). Sommers' "rule for enforcing ambiguity", which forbids a certain M-configuration in the language tree, is such a rule. The rule states that if P and Q are univocal, i.e., not ambiguous, then "there can be no three things such that P applies to a and b but not c while Q applies to b and c but not a" (p. 42). This rule is similar to Gilbert Ryle's rule about category mistakes, which Ryle applied to Descartes' dualistic ontology of mind and body. Sommers took his rule toprovide a test of the categorial coherence of a theory. "Any theory that breaks the rule, i.e., permits the M-configuration involving three individuals and two terms, is categorially flawed and can be rendered coherent by doing any number of things -- most prominently, enforcing ambiguity on at least one of the terms" (p. 45).

In his account of term functor logic (TFL), Sommers claimed that Aristotle recognized not one, but four "logical copulae" that connect the two terms of a categorical sentence. The English versions of these copulae are 'belongs to every', 'belongs to no', 'belongs to some' and 'does not belong to some'. One copula can be taken as fundamental, however, with the others defined in terms of that one copula and term negation. Using the plus sign, '+', as an operator that combines two terms to form a new (complex) term, we can represent the sentence `Some scholar is a philosopher' by the complex term P+S, with 'P' for 'philosopher' and 'S' for 'scholar', which can be read as 'Some S is P'. This is the fundamental or basic copula in TFL. Using '-' for term negation, a sentence of the form 'Some L is not an M' can then be symbolized as (-M)+L. A sentence of the form 'A belongs to every B' can be defined as the negation of 'A does not belong to some B', which can be symbolized as -((-A)+B). Finally, 'No B is A' is equivalent to the negation of 'Some B is A', which can be symbolized as -(A+B). Some syllogistic arguments are illustrated in terms of TFL, but we will forego the details here.

Existence is not a real property of things, according to Englebretsen, and so 'exists' not a term. Nevertheless, existence is a property, but instead of being a property of things it is a property of domains of discourse. "To say such things as 'x exists', 'Something is an x', 'There is an x', 'There are xs', etc., is to characterize not x but the domain relative to which such a statement is made" (p. 95f). Existence and reality are not the same, moreover, because whereas existence is a property of domains of discourse, reality (the actual world) is a primitive, undefined domain. The reality of individuals is defined in terms of their "presence in the real world" (p. 115).

Englebretsen holds that true statements are made true by their correspondence to facts. But facts are not in the world. Rather, facts, whether positive or negative, are "constitutive properties" of the actual world, and in general when other worlds or domains are in question the facts of those worlds or domains are similarly "constitutive properties" of those domains. Among domains there are impossible as well as possible worlds such as fictional worlds and incomplete worlds of intentional attitudes. Every object of whatever world is in every world, even if it does not have "presence" in a world or in the actual world. "All worlds are domains of discourse. All domains of discourse are worlds or determinable parts of such worlds. One world is real, our world, the actual world" (p, 133). Unreal worlds, moreover, depend on us, "They come into being simply by speakers making statements relative to them" (p. 133f).

According to Englebretsen, a "metaphysical theory that highlights the important, but now often neglected, role of the world . . . is called mondialism" (pp. 114f). Thus, the theory of truth as correspondence to fact where facts are properties of domains is a mondial theory, and "so is the theory that existence is not a property of things but of domains" (p. 115). That is why Englebretsen calls Sommers' term logic mondial logic and why his overall metaphysical framework is a version of mondialism.