Rock, Bone, and Ruin: An Optimist's Guide to the Historical Sciences

Placeholder book cover

Adrian Currie, Rock, Bone, and Ruin: An Optimist's Guide to the Historical Sciences, MIT Press, 2018, 372pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262037266.

Reviewed by Derek Skillings, University of Pennsylvania


In the postscript of his book, Adrian Currie suggests that the history of 20th century philosophy of science "would be a very different beast" (310) if the sciences that were taken as models in the very beginning were archaeology, paleontology, or geology as opposed to physics and chemistry. "How might things have been different if our standard examples of evidence were rock, bone, and ruin, not readouts from mass spectrometers or paths through cloud chambers?" (310). Currie doesn't know if there is an answer to this question, but this wide-ranging and ambitious book gives us a sketch of what that alternative beast might look like.

The book takes the historical sciences as both a target and a model for philosophical analysis. These are those messy sciences where researchers must deal with incomplete evidence, faint signals, and an inability to generate new data via experiments. The book is most straightforwardly an argument for optimism about the prospects of the historical sciences, but to write it off as just that would be to sell it short. In truth, I think the argument for optimism and why it matters is the least persuasive part of the book and is overshadowed by the other things the book offers. The kinds of "unlucky" cases that Currie considers have been widely neglected in the philosophy of science. As a resource for interesting and well-illustrated case studies where scientists are doing their best to make due in non-ideal circumstances, that alone is worth the price of admission.

A running theme is that we often think of historical scientists to be in "unlucky circumstances". That is, they are often faced with ambiguous and degraded evidence, gappy records, and an inability to generate new evidence via experiments or the like. This, naturally, leads to a pessimism about the prospects of historical science. Currie thinks pessimistic attitudes are mistaken because they underestimate the kinds of evidence available to historical scientists and their access to it. The major task of the book is to show how historical scientists aren't nearly as unlucky as we might think at first glance, and even when they are in unlucky circumstances, the epistemic resources available to them warrants an optimism about future explanatory success.

The argument against pessimism in the historical sciences moves forward through a positive and enriched account of the "aims, methods, and epistemic resources of the historical sciences" (12). It is this account that I found to be the most successful part of the book, most importantly because: "In one important sense, this is not a book about the historical sciences. Rather, it is a book about how science works under non-ideal circumstances" (12). By moving away from a focus on "best-case scenarios" we get a feel for "science's disunified, opportunistic side" (13). This makes the "Big Theories and Big Episodes" mode of philosophy of science less tempting because we see its limited value for understanding science as a whole. The real action is local, and "there is very little we can say that is both general, abstract, and explanatory" (21). In the postscript Currie argues that traditional accounts of scientific progress get things wrong, and furthermore, that positions on scientific realism or antirealism that rely on generalizing across science become extremely problematic once we recognize science's disparate, varied nature.

In what follows I will summarize the contents of the book, focusing on a few points where I found myself either particularly engaged or skeptical. Currie covers a lot of ground, which seems both a necessity and his bane. In order to make the case that the real action is local, and that methodology and epistemic warrant are closely tied to particulars and context, it is necessary to cover a wide range of case studies and topics. So we find ourselves moving between discussions of the nature of trace evidence, common cause explanations, consilience, coherence, models, regularities, analogies, simulations, surrogate experiments, idealizations, difference-makers, and the identification of "smoking guns". Often just when I felt we were getting into the meat of things, it would be time to move on to another issue. Given the larger project of the book, this occasional superficiality is not a big problem in the end. But you won't get a full treatment of any of these issues if that is what you are looking for. Nonetheless, Currie is a lively writer and excited interlocutor, and it is hard not to catch that excitement as you move through the book.

In keeping with the overall focus on science-as-it-is-practiced, chapter 1 opens with a case study to introduce the major themes of the book. A lesson about the surprisingly wide range of information that can be learned from a single tooth left behind by an extinct platypus moves into outlining the many ways in which historical scientists control their epistemic fates. Chapter 2 lays out two case studies at length, sauropod evolution and the "snowball earth" hypothesis. Chapters 3-5 go through the proposed grounds for pessimism about the historical sciences. Carol Cleland and Derek Turner play the role of his foils for much of this discussion. On the given pessimistic account, historical sciences rely solely on physical evidence, or traces, left by past events. Chapter 3 develops an epistemic account of traces by linking them directly to middle-range theories, theories that identify dependency relations between past events and their traces. This opens up two routes to uncovering new traces:

we can discover traces by making new finds that, by our midrange theories, tell us about the past. Or, we can do more with the remains we have. That is, we can refine midrange theory. New traces are generated by the application of new technology and theories. (85)

Chapter 4 focuses on the work of Cleland and Turner, and the relation between evidence and historical hypotheses. Cleland -- an optimist but, Currie thinks, for bad reasons -- represents overdetermination of hypotheses and Turner -- a pessimist -- represents underdetermination of hypotheses. Currie makes a few nice moves here, pulling the Cleland and Turner views together in a way that allows for more optimistic conclusions about our access to the past. This crucially will depend on whether the sort of epistemic underdetermination of hypotheses will be resolved. Turner thinks not, Currie thinks so. I am unconvinced that Turner is wrong, and Currie doesn't give us enough to really turn the tables. I will address this worry in more detail later in the review.

In chapter 5, Currie introduces what he calls the "ripple model of evidence" to illustrate what evidence is available to historical scientists. It is a clever metaphor and is helpful for showing how the different evidential concepts he lays out interact. The model incorporates both information-destroying and information-preserving processes. Currie wraps up this chunk of the book by laying out the case for pessimism. It rests on three claims: (1) our available evidence about the past is limited to traces, (2) we are unlikely to uncover further traces, and (3) historical scientists cannot manufacture new evidence. Currie thinks each of these claims is false, and would be even if it were the case that historical scientists are always stuck in unlucky circumstances. Chapters 6-11 go to work at trying to undermine the arguments for pessimism.

Chapter 6 is the pivot point. It's where Currie introduces a different picture of the historical sciences, one that will support an increased optimism about their prospects. It is also the most exciting part of the book. He argues against a methodological "essence" of historical science that relies solely on traces. He never wastes an opportunity to use a turn of phrase and he expounds on one of his favorites here. Historical scientists are "methodological omnivores" (138). "By opportunistically exploiting a variety of methods, our epistemic reach is maximized. There is no 'essence' of historical method -- and this is why it works so well" (160). Currie argues that appealing to "global principles" when evaluating traces obscures the real, local action. Any particular methodological approaches "should be preferred (when they ought to be), not because of some general license but because of a set of local facts" (139). Advocates of a methodological essence get wrong "the actual patterns of reasoning that historical scientists employ" because they ignore the other types of evidence that available to historical scientists (148).

The main argument against pessimism is that historical scientists have access to a lot more evidence beyond that of traces. They can appeal to other kinds of surrogative evidence, namely analogies, models, and simulations. Chapters 7 and 8 attack the claim that historical scientists are limited to trace evidence by defending the role of analogy in the historical sciences.

Where traces are evidence by virtue of midrange theories that connect them to the past through lines of causation, analogies are evidence by virtue of being tokens of the same type of process. Analogies are instances of a regularity or pattern and are therefore empirically relevant to those patterns and each other. (167)

Chapters 9 and 10 argue that historical scientists are not distinguished by an inability to "manufacture" evidence, as opposed to the experimental scientists who do so through the construction of manipulative experiments. Currie argues that historical scientists "can use surrogates such as simulations to make their own luck, analogously to how an experimentalist does" (136). More strongly, he says that “although I do not think that we should take simulations and experiments to be the same kind of activity, I argue that under certain circumstances simulations play explicitly experiment-like roles—and do so successfully" (25). Scientific investigation proceeds in a piecemeal fashion because "A body of knowledge must be sufficiently supported, must 'form a scaffold,' in order for further evidence to become relevant" (250). One way to do that is by generating evidence via experiments. Currie argues "that in historical science, models often function and idealize as they do in order to construct, reach, and exceed these scaffolds" (250). As with analogies, models and simulations add to the total store of evidence available to historical scientists.

Chapter 11 claims that the arguments against pessimism go further and, in the end, promote optimism. I both agree and disagree with Currie here. On the claim that we should be much more optimistic about the prospects of the historical sciences then we might have been had we continued to think the only thing available to historical scientists is trace evidence, I am convinced. That we shouldn't be pessimistic about the prospects of the historical sciences in comparison to the experimental sciences has me less convinced. To be fair to Currie, this second sense of optimism doesn't concern him much. He thinks that comparing historical and experimental science is not the standard for proclaiming about optimism and wants to take historical science on its own terms (21). But comparative optimism seems exactly the standard that many have in mind, especially some of the authors that Currie is critical of, like Turner. And it is in that comparative sense that we have grounds for a relative pessimism about the historical sciences.

The epistemic tools used in historical science and that underlie Currie's argument for optimism -- the methodological omnivory, the ability to tie together many strands of evidence, the scaffolded progress -- are not uniquely characteristic of the historical sciences. The experimental sciences need not be methodological specialists either, and when experimental scientists are in "unlucky situations" they can, and do, turn to simulations, models, and analogies as well. Currie's revised picture of the historical sciences does not change much about the comparative disadvantage faced by historical scientists, and so does not appear to change the relative, let's say reduced optimism, that we might have about their prospects compared to the experimental sciences.

Chapter 11 also argues for the importance of what Currie calls "empirically grounded" speculation. This "involves formulating a hypothesis that (1) significantly outruns the available evidence, and (2) generates epistemic or empirical goods that increase epistemic traction" (289). Currie argues for moving "beyond simple description into the bold and the speculative" in the hope of generating "more opportunities for testing" and unlocking "new avenues of investigation" (286). Co-opting archaeologist Holly Hayter, he says that "A storybook is not only more satisfying than a laundry list, it is also better science. Why? Because, for scientists in unlucky circumstances, progress is driven by speculation" (285). He argues

that historical investigation proceeds most fruitfully when scientists let their imaginations loose, since hypotheses must be put forward in order for us to figure out how to make empirical progress. Historical science is rich with examples of surprising discoveries made on the basis of outlandish hunches, guesses, and hypotheses -- indeed, getting things wrong can often be a crucial scaffold for getting things right. (18)

This might all be true, but Currie focuses entirely on the epistemic upshots of speculation and the epistemic risks involved. However, the sciences don't exist in a protective bubble. There are other reasons we might not want to speculate far beyond what we have strong evidence for. Take, for example, human evolution and the investigation of purported sex-based differences in cognition or personality traits. Just-so stories and wild speculations that outrun the available evidence in the field of evolutionary psychology carry more than just epistemic risk. They can reinforce negative and harmful stereotypes that trickle out to further fuel existing bad justifications for social behavior or bad explanations for social differences related to sex or race.

Currie finishes by looking at the practical upshots of optimism about the historical sciences in chapter 12, and the consequences of his approach for traditional debates in the philosophy of science such as scientific realism. Currie's focus on scientific practice, the importance of a problem's local context, and the variety of epistemic strategies that scientists employ is, in my estimation, the right approach to the philosophical investigation of any science. I am with Currie when he says that we need to move away from Big Theories and universal claims about how science proceeds. This book is a wonderful example of how to move between the relevant scientific details and the broader conceptual issues that characterize a particular set of scientific practices.