Roman Reflections: Studies in Latin Philosophy

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Gareth D. Williams and Katharina Volk (eds.), Roman Reflections: Studies in Latin Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2016, 306pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199999767.

Reviewed by Brad Inwood, Yale University


The relationship between serious philosophical work and the language and culture of its practitioners can be a tricky topic. We may aspire to a kind of universalist purity and objectivity, but in many areas of philosophy we may find ourselves enmeshed in, conditioned by our language and culture. The volume under review sets out to explore a particular instance of this generalization, philosophy written in the context of ancient Roman culture and mostly in Latin. Its thirteen chapters are the descendants of papers presented to a conference at Columbia University in 2012; I also participated in the conference but have otherwise not been involved with the book under review. It was a bold and innovative conference and the resulting book has much to offer, not just to students of ancient philosophy (too often taken to be a synonym for Greek philosophy) and Roman culture (whose philosophical strand is too seldom given the attention it merits) but also to philosophers and historians of philosophy interested in the influence of language, culture and historical context on the substance of their work.

Some of the papers focus on language, the use and impact of the Latin language in philosophical writing; others emphasize the importance of ancient Roman culture; and others are, at least on the surface, essays on particular philosophical issues and problems. There is relatively little overt theorizing about the relationship between language, culture and philosophical content, but there is much to be learned from working through the varied case studies that make up the collection. One further limitation of the book is worth noting. Though the conference was on 'Latin philosophy' and that formulation persists in the subtitle of the book, the chronological boundaries of the collection are strict; Augustine is the latest author covered. But philosophy continued to be written in Latin for many centuries and in many different cultural contexts. There is room still for serious diachronic exploration of the importance of Latin as a philosophical medium from its beginnings, as studied here, to the eighteenth century.

The book begins (Part I) with a masterful study of the way Romans talked about the practice of philosophy. Harry Hine's study ('Philosophy and philosophi: From Cicero to Apuleius', chapter 1) of how the verb 'to philosophize' and the noun 'philosopher' were used by Roman authors illustrates the ambivalence they felt about self-identifying as philosophi (a description apparently thought to be too professional for the elite to embrace) even as they happily confessed to doing philosophy. This reluctance to embrace the label 'philosopher' faded in later centuries but it is a telling reflection on the place of philosophy in classical Roman culture. One wonders whether there are parallels to this uneasiness about a professional identity in other times and places and whether the Romans' own ambivalence about the label, rather than the activity itself, contributes to a persistent reluctance to count Roman philosophers as the real thing.

The rest of the book is divided into three parts defined chronologically: Part II, "The Late Republic" (Cicero, Lucretius and their contemporaries), Part III, "Seneca", and Part IV, "Beyond Seneca" (which includes papers on Epictetus, the Platonist Apuleius and Augustine). But another division among the papers is also apparent. Some focus heavily on the relationship between the Latin language and philosophical content, others on cultural factors. Though the separation isn't perfect, it is worthwhile to look at the more linguistic papers together.

Tobias Reinhardt ('To See and to Be Seen: On Vision and Perception in Lucretius and Cicero', chapter 4) analyses the use of Latin verbs for seeing and the significance of the semantic implications and constraints of these words for their application to epistemological debate. This is of critical importance not just because in Latin (as in English and Greek) vision is the paradigmatic sense modality but especially because Cicero's technical translations for the key Greek word phantasia are forms of the verb videre. Specialists in Stoicism and Academic skepticism have long fretted about the fact that the Greek term (derived from a word for appearing or making manifest) and Cicero's Latin term (visum) come from such different semantic fields; now Reinhardt gives us a solid foundation for exploring the philosophical importance of this difference. Andrew M. Riggsby ('Tyrants, Fire, and Dangerous Things,' chapter 6) applies to Seneca's treatise On Anger a broadly Lakoffian analysis of the metaphors constitutive of the Latin vocabulary for the powerful phenomena of anger, rage, etc. In Latin anger is generally described with the language of heat, expansive pressure, madness and animal wildness, and Riggsby argues that Seneca's adoption of those tropes is more than mere Latinity, that he deliberately exploits those features of the language to make his Stoic argument about anger and its therapy more persuasive to his readers. This rich chapter is somewhat more accessible to those who don't read Latin than Reinhardt's and opens the door to more systematic comparative work than could be accommodated in this book. Richard Fletcher ('Platonizing Latin: Apuleius's Phaedo', chapter 12) gives us an adventurous and revealing study of how one later Latin philosopher from North Africa (Apuleius of Madauros, second century CE) worked when he translated Plato's Greek description of the Forms into Latin. The story is inevitably speculative, given the tiny shreds surviving of Apuleius' translation, but Fletcher's essay deploys a powerful apparatus from translation theory to get his suggestive results; we of course need more detail, but Fletcher shows how different Apuleius' technique must have been from that of Cicero and Seneca and, again, suggests a wide field for future work.

I turn now to papers focused more on the importance of Roman culture for philosophy. Katharina Volk ('Roman Pythagoras', chapter 2) grapples with the (to us) puzzling phenomenon of the revival of Pythagoreanism in Rome in the late first century BCE. Our own somewhat shallow generalizations about Roman culture as being particularly well aligned with Stoicism are challenged by the Romans' own fascination with their imagined historical links to a group of philosophers that even Aristotle called 'the Italian school'; Volk's examination is very helpful in sorting out the apparent puzzle. James E. G. Zetzel's exercise in contextualization ('Philosophy Is in the Streets', chapter 3) puts a welcome emphasis on the wider social practice of philosophy and the importance of, for example, the largely lost satires written by Varro (the contemporary of Cicero who too seldom appears in our discussions of Roman philosophy). Matthew Roller ('Precept(or) and Example in Seneca', chapter 7) gives us an extended study of Seneca's exploitation of a distinctively Roman cultural practice, the systematic use of historical examples to make a moral or political point. Seneca builds on the practices of his culture and this chapter illustrates how hard it would be to appreciate the philosophical significance of his work if we didn't have a clear sense of this widespread Roman cultural practice. Seneca is also the focus of Yelena Baraz's 'True Greatness of Soul in Seneca's De constantia sapientis' (chapter 8) and Gareth D. Williams' 'Minding the Gap: Seneca, the Self, and the Sublime' (chapter 9). Baraz treats the 'greatness' of the Stoic sage in the context of both Roman and Greek antecedents; her study sheds light on one of Seneca's less studied works and explores some of the conceptual and cultural challenges of the Stoic ideal of the sage. Williams deals with some of the same issues in his analysis of the 'gap' between the ideal and the mundane in Stoicism, especially as manifested in a wide range of Seneca's works. He situates his analysis on a wonderfully broad intellectual canvas, and his discussion of two concepts important well beyond Stoicism, the sublime and the self, will make this chapter particularly rewarding for a wide range of readers.

I have left to the end four chapters of more focused interest to philosophers and in particular to ancient philosophy specialists. Gretchen Reydams-Schils ('Teaching Pericles: Cicero on the Study of Nature', chapter 5) tackles the critical question of the relationship between natural philosophy and ethics in Stoicism, drawing on a thorough understanding of Cicero's views about the history of philosophy, including an analysis of his often neglected rhetorical works. There are fresh insights here about a wide range of Ciceronian philosophy (and a reminder that he is his own man rather than a conduit for dilute Stoicism or standard-issue Academic skepticism), but for me the most important results concern Cicero's De Finibus. Book 3 of this dialogue, arguably Cicero's most important philosophical work, tends to be used somewhat mechanically as a source for Stoic ethics. Though this old-fashioned trend is now fading somewhat, Reydams-Schils shows decisively how critical it is to be "cautious in using this account as evidence for a Stoic ethics without physics". Such are the fruits of seeing Cicero not just in the context of Roman culture but even more importantly in the full context of his own works.

Margaret Graver ('The Emotional Intelligence of Epicureans: Doctrinalism and Adaptation in Seneca's Epistles', chapter 10) provides comparably valuable insight into Seneca's philosophical practice. Beginning from the familiar puzzle of the Stoic Seneca's frequently sympathetic treatment of and even adaptation of Epicurean ideas, Graver reveals a Seneca honestly open to good ideas and clear evidence about human nature and values, no matter what the source. Whether it is kind to call this kind of openness 'philosophical opportunism' (p. 203) is a delicate question; what Seneca is really after, Graver argues, is a clear, true understanding of human psychology because "ethical systems need to be grounded in the realities of human nature" (p. 206) and Epicureans can sometimes give him that. This refreshing pragmatism (captured in Seneca's own maxim 'quod verum est meum est', Epistle 12) should make us think twice about the common picture of ancient philosophers as being loyal to their schools almost to a fault; Stoics, at least, transcend that stereotype regularly.

In recent years two of the more broadly interesting areas of ancient philosophy -- interesting to those outside the specialist field, that is -- have been skepticism and an attractive contextual particularism in ethics. The last two papers address these themes head on. Wolfgang-Rainer Mann ('"You're Playing You Now": Helvidius Priscus as a Stoic Hero', chapter 11) looks at a particularly intense example of Roman cultural influence on a philosopher writing in Greek, with a critical examination of Epictetus' anecdote about Helvidius Priscus (Diss. 1.2), the Roman senator who refused on principle to be bullied by the Emperor. Epictetus' view about the ethical principles illustrated by this event is, Mann argues, often misunderstood. What is primarily at issue is not the particular, fully situated obligations of a man with a particular role to play in his place and time, but a more general obligation incumbent on him as a rational human being. Mann's analysis of the Stoic theory -- or theories -- about 'roles' (prosōpa, personae in Greek and Latin respectively) is highly sophisticated and contributes to an active debate among specialists, but the wider importance of his essay lies in its challenge to those who enlist Stoics, and Epictetus in particular, in the cause of particularist rather than universalist moral theories.

Katja Maria Vogt sheds light on the historical development of skepticism. Her contribution ('Why Ancient Skeptics Don't Doubt the Existence of the External World: Augustine and the Beginnings of Modern Skepticism', chapter 13) argues that Augustine himself lays the foundation for a characteristically modern form of skepticism focused on doubts about the reality of the external world as a whole, an approach which is not found in ancient skepticism. She argues that we can see this development in Augustine himself, in the gap between the Academic works like Contra Academicos and the mature and much more influential De Trinitate. If she is right, we have all the more reason to regret that the study of Latin philosophy in this volume stops with Augustine. The story she tells is one of the fading influence of ancient Greco-Roman philosophical culture and the emergence of new problems that, in the first instance at least, were open only to Latin-reading philosophers with Augustine at their disposal. Following up on the issues raised here would, I suspect, shed fresh light on the transition from medieval to modern philosophy in western Europe, a juncture where the linguistic matrix for philosophical work once again proves to be crucial.

This is a wide-ranking and thought-provoking collection. Some of the more linguistic chapters will inevitably be tough going for those without access to Latin and Greek, but most will yield their rewards to any reader interested in the topic. The papers vary widely in topic and approach, and the press is to be commended for not insisting on a tighter focus to give the book more 'unity'. I would myself have welcomed more explicit theoretical treatment of questions about philosophy's relationship to the contingencies of language, culture and history, but the thirteen papers presented here provide (in addition to many excellent specialist discussions) a rich resource for reflection on those topics.