Rorty, Pragmatism, and Confucianism: With Responses by Richard Rorty

Placeholder book cover

Yong Huang (ed.), Rorty, Pragmatism, and Confucianism: With Responses by Richard Rorty, SUNY Press, 2009, 324pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780791476833.

Reviewed by Jung H. Lee, Northeastern University



The essays in this volume stem from a conference held on “Rorty, Pragmatism, and Chinese Philosophy” in Shanghai as the culminating event of Rorty’s lecture tour of China in 2004. The selected papers include contributions on Rorty’s views on epistemology, relativism, moral philosophy, human nature, religion, and socio-political philosophy. All of the essays attempt to weave Rorty’s ideas into a conversation with Chinese philosophy in general and Confucian thinkers (most notably Confucius and Mencius) in particular. As the editor notes in his deft introduction, “some have found surprising similarities, while others notice unignorable differences; some try to use Confucianism to modify Rorty’s ideas, while others try to appropriate Rorty’s philosophy to update Confucianism” (2). The volume concludes with a sober set of responses by Rorty to his critics that gives pause to those who would wish to see Rorty as a latter day Confucian or, worse, see Confucius or Mencius as a former day Rortian. Although the quality of the essays is uneven at times, the work as a whole is a solid contribution in comparative philosophy and contemporary Confucian studies.

The volume is divided into four sections that feature major themes in Rorty’s work. Part I, “Relativity, Contingency, and Moral Progress”, begins with Kuang-ming Wu’s essay on “Rorty, Confucius, and Intercultural Relativism”. Wu argues that “relativism properly defined” describes the modus operandi of both Confucius and Rorty. According to Wu, relativism (1) challenges “final absolutist fixation”; (2) is constantly open to “actual ideas, people, and shifting situations”; and (3) takes part in “ongoing conversations”. The hallmark of such relativism, from Wu’s perspective, is the kind of “story-thinking” that eschews analytical thought and “final whole truth”.

It is difficult to determine who in fact fits the profile of Wu’s “absolutists”, those analytical thinkers who are obsessed with the “final whole truth” and who have an allergic reaction to open mindedness and conversation. Conversely, the categorization of Confucius and Mencius as “relativists” seems to elide the strong normative bent of both the Analects and the Mencius. In other words, while Confucius and Mencius do not utter “absolutist” declarations, they clearly do see certain ways of life, certain norms of conduct, certain modes of being as qualitatively better than others. Further, as Rorty himself acknowledges, early Confucians seem to possess a faith in tradition and all that it entails that a “liberal ironist” could never accept. If anything, all that Wu has illustrated is that early Confucians and Rorty share a methodological or meta-philosophical appreciation of narrative and story telling, something that could be said of many “absolutists” as well.

Chung-ying Cheng, in “On Three Contingencies in Richard Rorty: A Confucian Critique”, challenges Rorty’s liberal ironist project from a Confucian perspective, asking whether the kind of liberal society Rorty envisions can be had without common aspirations based on normative guides for human nature, community, and justice. In fact, Cheng goes so far as to suggest that Rorty’s “philosophy of contingency rests on a metaphysical view of chance and atemporality”: “It does not occur to Rorty that if one could sincerely wish no cruelty for others, he or she must have something deep in his or her self that makes him or her so wish” (48, 47). On cue, Rorty in his response suggests that the meaningful question is not “Which vocabulary cuts nature at the joints?” but “Which vocabulary is more useful for achieving human purposes?” For Rorty, the sense of contingency and history goes all the way down and there are no useful purposes for such outdated notions as “human nature” or “the Way of Heaven”, even at the purely normative level.

Yong Huang in his contribution (“Rorty’s Progress into Confucian Truths”) asks “what sense Rorty can make of progress and hope after he rejects representationalism and universalism” (74). To this end, Huang suggests that Rorty’s ideas on hope and progress can better articulate two Confucian truths — namely, (1) moral progress is the expansion of the circle of those who can be counted as “us”; and (2) such progress can be made without adopting some moral universalism, whether of a Kantian model or of a Mohist model. Although Huang is quick to dismiss universalisms like that of Kant or Mozi, it is difficult to see how the notion of morality as impartiality can be preserved in a moral system where non-moral differences are given moral weight. As he suggests, “we should love different people and things in ways that are appropriate to them” (85). Of course, this kind of partiality threatens the very core of the kind of liberalism that Rorty champions in terms of social justice, civil rights, and universal beneficence. In this sense, Huang’s notion of a “Confucian Rortian” seems like an oxymoron rather than a “better Rortian”.

Part II, “Morality and Human Nature”, begins with two contributions — one from Peimin Ni and the other from James Behuniak — that attempt to bridge the putative philosophical distance between Mencius, specifically his theory of human nature, and Rorty’s pragmatism. Ni wants to read Mencius in a less metaphysical, more therapeutic way that can lead “people to anchor a sense of sacredness of one’s mission inside oneself” (114). Meanwhile, Behuniak suggests that the similarities between Rorty and Mencius can be brought into relief only if we jettison the “essentialist” interpretations of Mencius and see his view of human nature as an “historical and normative notion” (118).

There are two general points I would like to make here. First, I think it is a misrepresentation to characterize the debate between Mencius and Mohists as one involving the “reason/sentiment” distinction. Although it is convenient to pigeonhole Mozi as an unfeeling “rationalist”, his problems with Confucian “partiality” stemmed not from any undue emphasis on emotion but in the sense of fairness that he believed was being compromised in the Confucian attitude towards special relations, particularly those towards the family. In fact, when Mencius sounds his warning call against the ways of Yang and Mo, it is not the lack of sentiment that causes his alarm but the “deviance” of views that block the path of humaneness and rightness.

Secondly, while I agree with Behuniak that we should avoid essentializing characterizations of Mencius’s theory of human nature, it seems irresponsible to not also point out the biological and metaphysical foundations of Mencius’s theory. Mencius defines humanity in terms of what he considers to be the natural endowment of all human beings. That is to say, he is making a universal claim, in both descriptive and normative terms, about human nature and its proper course of development. For Mencius, human beings are compelled to act morally because virtuous actions reflect the true nature of human beings and serve the original design of Heaven (tian ). Rorty, in his response, recognizes just how far apart he is from Mencius when he states, “I am suspicious of theories of human nature such as Mencius’s because, like the positivists, I think that it is useful to separate assertions that can be confirmed or disconfirmed by empirical evidence from all other assertions” (285).

Robert Allinson, in the most sustained essay of the volume, acknowledges, with Rorty and pace Ni and Behuniak, that Mencius’s theory of human nature is indeed a metaphysical one and not merely normative. According to Allinson, the power of Mencius’s theory derives from the way that the theory “supervenes upon a human nature capable of responding to such a theory” (130). However, as Rorty notes, even if we show that all counterexamples to such a metaphysical theory are due to degenerate acculturation, how could we determine which cultures are more in accord with nature than others or which faculties would be more fully human? As he argues,

it is my inability to answer this question that leads me to think that an appeal to ‘metaphysical’ truths is as dubious an intellectual maneuver as an invocation of divine judgment on the sons of Ham, or as an appeal to the widespread belief that sodomy is an unnatural practice (289).

Sor-hoon Tan begins Part III, “Postmodernism: Community, Literature, and Value”, with an essay on “A Confucian Response to Rorty’s Postmodern Liberal Idea of Community”. Tan attempts to reconcile Rorty’s separation of public and private by offering “a Confucian response” — not necessarily “what the historical Confucius and his followers actually believed and intentionally advocated in their own time” but one of any number of possible interpretations of Confucian texts (163). To this end, she suggests that private pursuits should follow in the wake of one’s social hopes: “A Confucian would be less concerned with privacy, more concerned with improving and extending the community” (174). Rorty in his response, while appreciative of Tan’s efforts, wonders why we should be grounding proposals for political change by reference to “cultural tradition” rather than history, or what actually has been seen to “work”. This makes all the more sense to Rorty since we can do away with exercises in selective reading as we attempt to reconcile un-liberal sentiments in such texts as the Gospels and the Analects with contemporary liberal ideals.

The next two contributions — Hans-Georg Moeller’s “Philosophy and Literature: Rorty and Confucianism” and Chengyang Li’s “Coping with Incommensurable Pursuits: Rorty, Berlin, and the Confucian-Daoist Complementarity” — address Rorty’s thoughts on the separation of private pursuits and public solidarity. Moeller presents a nuanced cultural archeology of the functions of philosophy and literature in Chinese culture, pursuits that were often not seen as specifically private endeavors but as “disciplines for the integration into a tradition and into a nature” (191). This suggests to Moeller that both visions — the Chinese and Rortian — “seem to be contingent semantic constructions of the roles of philosophy and literature within particular social frameworks” (192).

Li addresses Rorty’s private/public distinction by first comparing Rorty with Berlin and his interpretation of Machiavelli and then with what he calls the “Confucian-Daoist model of complementarity”. From Li’s perspective, Rorty fails to recognize the tensions between one’s private and public pursuits, ignoring how different value systems “prioritize values differently” (205). The Confucian-Daoist model of complementarity allows each value system to “play different roles and to complement each other in society” (206). Rorty in his response remains unconvinced about the utility of “prioritizing values” and suggests instead that a narrative approach that sees competing value systems as stories that one chooses would be a more effective way of “inculcating moral sentiments and preferences” (295).

The final part of the volume, “The ‘Other’: Nature, Reality, and Transcendence”, addresses Rorty’s considered views on nature and religion. Marjorie C. Miller argues in "Rortian Extremes and the Confucian Zhongyong" that “Rorty’s insistence on language to replace Dewey’s notion of experience masks what we use our language with and for rather than opening the way to effective transactions with our experience” (214). According to Miller, Confucian notions of harmony can help to temper Rorty’s language of mastery and adaptation that can often lead to “the sorts of technological approaches that result in high unfortunate consequences” (215). Here I think the question of commensurability between early Confucianism and Rorty’s brand of Pragmatism can be raised again. As Rorty states in his response, he does not value the virtue of harmony, either in the self or in the cosmos, and finds no cash value in using terms like “the universe” or “the world” in totalistic ways. For Rorty, it is dissonance — not harmony — that animates intellectual and moral progress, creating an “increased range of possible forms of life” (295).

The final two essays in the volume present competing interpretations of Confucian religiosity, particularly in regard to the concepts of transcendence and tradition. James Kelly Clark argues that we can read Confucius as a full-blooded “theist” who viewed “Heaven” (tian ) as a transcendent body. As he rightly notes, “Rorty’s embrace of contingency, rejection of human nature, assumption of liberal democracy, and consequent rejection of traditional morality are all foreign to Confucius’s moral vision” (246). Roger Ames conversely argues for an interpretation of tian that is immanent not transcendent, akin to Dewey’s conception of the religious in A Common Faith. For Ames, Confucius’s religiosity can be expressed as “an ‘a-theistic’ yet still religious naturalism that has no need for positing the existence of a supernatural being” (264). Like Rorty’s notion of “religion as romance”, Confucian spirituality, according to Ames, “emerges out of inspired human experience itself” (268).

Rorty, in his response to Ames, articulates a concern that I believe plagues most of the contributions to the volume in regard to the fittingness or compatibility of Confucianism with Pragmatism. As Rorty notes,

The difference between Deweyan pragmatism and Confucianism seems to me epitomized in the contrast between the Romantic poet and the Confucian sage. The former prides himself on bringing something new into the universe. The latter prides himself, just as does the Abrahamic theologian, on being in touch with something that has always been around … The sage does not view himself as commanding a world into being, but as perceiving an order that brings together all possible worlds. The sage is an exemplary person because of his relation to this order … Perhaps the biggest difference between Dewey and Confucius is simply that the one thought novelty, and the other tradition, was the greater danger (299).

The “differences” between the Confucian sage and the Romantic poet seem so vast that one wonders what the genuine points of contact are between the two traditions. Accordingly, some of the comparisons that are essayed in the volume seem either trivial (e.g., the importance of narrative to both Confucius and Rorty) or misguided (e.g., casting Confucius as a Rortian relativist). Or, to take an example that was not discussed at length in the volume, it would seem at first blush well-nigh impossible to reconcile Rorty’s conversationalist view of truth and knowledge with the kind of common sense epistemology found in most Confucian texts. In other words, thinkers like Confucius and Xunzi believed that one’s view of truth and knowledge is constrained by how the world actually is. This specific contrast highlights a broader incompatibility between the two traditions: Rorty believes that there are no privileged vocabularies for our various practices whereas Confucians believe that there are, that texts like the Yijing and Shijing contain timeless truths, that Zhou theology and metaphysics actually describe the world as it is, and that rites reveal a pattern of sacred human behavior.

Although Rorty does not go so far as to suggest that the two traditions are logically incompatible, I would argue that the differences go so deep that one could reasonably conclude that the normative commitments of Confucians and Rortians are incompatible. Although logical incompatibility does require, at some level, that each rival tradition can recognize that it is one and the same subject matter on which they are making claims (as Confucians and Rortians implicitly seem to do in identifying the subject matter as morality, truth, religion, etc.), it nevertheless acknowledges cases where

one such tradition may frame its theses by means of concepts such that the falsity of theses upheld within one or more other traditions is entailed, yet at the same time no or insufficient common standards are available by which to judge between rival standpoints.1

It is not then that Confucians and Pragmatists do not share some standards — were it not so they would not be able to disagree as they do — but the range of shared understandings is not sufficient to bridge the imaginative gaps between the two worldviews. Ultimately, Confucians and Pragmatists should not be interpreted as offering rival versions of one and the same subject matter but rival ways of articulating the subject matter in the interests of rival goals.

1 Alasdair MacIntyre, Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1998), p. 351.