Rousseau's Social Contract: An Introduction

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David Lay Williams, Rousseau's Social Contract: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 311pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521124447.

Reviewed by Christopher Bertram, University of Bristol


David Lay Williams's book is the latest addition to the enormous and varied literature on the Social Contract, and it is a very fine contribution. It offers the novice a secure companion to the original text, and it gives those already familiar with Rousseau an insightful interpretation that can sit alongside others. As such it is highly recommended. After a useful placing of Rousseau in his intellectual and historical context, Williams provides the reader with a chapter-by-chapter commentary, clarifying issues that will be obscure to a modern reader and signposting problems and disagreements with interpretation. He concludes with two appendices: the first giving a more synoptic account of the general will than emerges from the commentary itself; the second discussing Rousseau's attitude to women. Williams's treatment is accurate and reliable, but on two interlinked questions, namely, Rousseau's relationship to his native Geneva and his attitude to democracy, I wish he had said more than he does.

Rousseau's Social Contract remains, after a quarter of a millennium, one of the most controversial texts in the history of political philosophy, variously seen as a model for participatory democracy, a blueprint for totalitarianism, and several points in between. Thanks to its author's literary skills, it is a work that contains many of the great slogans; but thanks also to those skills it contains much that is deliberately paradoxical and provocative, such as the claim that citizens who are made to obey the general will are thereby "forced to be free". It is also a work through which many different intellectual currents flow, some of them subterranean. To name but a few, there is ancient philosophy (particularly Plato's), together with Hobbesian modernism, social contract theory with virtue ethics, Machiavellian republicanism and Malebranche's theology. The experience of the actual societies in which Rousseau lived, particularly Geneva and Venice, combines with his nostalgia for ancient republics and his hopes for new ones. A gloomy pessimism about the prospects for the human race is united with a sunny optimism about what might be possible in a virtuous republic. The book in which these elements are combined was, moreover, written in an intellectual context quite different from our own: one in which stultifying inequality and theological intolerance coexisted with lively Enlightenment salons and growing faith in the possibility of scientific and moral progress.

The Social Contract is read not only on account of this richness of synthesis, but also because of its subsequent influence on political thought. Without the Social Contact, perhaps no Kant, no Hegel, no Marx, and no Rawls. One might even argue, thanks to Rawls's reimagining of a Rousseauan social contract for a large society, that political philosophy today bears more of the mark of Rousseau's thinking than at any time in past 150 years. This combination of richness, readability and influence accounts for the fact that the Social Contract remains widely read, studied, and frequently prescribed to undergraduate students.

The structure of Williams's book is given by the Social Contract itself. After a scene-setting introduction situating the work within Rousseau's intellectual project -- particularly the first and second Discourses -- Williams takes us through Rousseau's text chapter-by-chapter, clarifying the argument, noting points of controversy and explaining the many obscure references. Only in two respects does he move away from this sequence: he opts to discuss the general will and the position of women in Rousseau's political philosophy in two appendices, rather than in the main commentary. The most important of these two appendices is the one on the general will, since it is the central organizing concept of Rousseau's political philosophy. It is certainly a perfectly understandable choice to put synoptic discussion of the general will in a separate chapter, given that Rousseau's own failure to give a systematic account of the ideas means that the reader has to piece together an interpretation from remarks that are scattered through various parts of the text (some of which are in acute tension with others), but it would be a pity if anyone were to get the impression that this discussion, in an "appendix", were anything other than an integral component of Williams's book. In fact it is central, and the reader might do well to look at it early on in the reading before coming back to it when necessary.

Williams offers us a moderate interpretation of Rousseau. He rejects both a purely formal and procedural interpretation of the general will and one that sees the general will as having an eternal and transcendent existence that is independent of the decisions and choices that citizens actually make. Formal procedures (together with fair background conditions) are necessary in making sure that the citizenry takes decisions that track the common good, and their actually taking those decisions is necessary to give effect to the general will. At the same time, procedure alone is not enough: if the expressed decision of the citizenry stray too far from what justice objectively requires, perhaps reflecting divisions within the citizenry, then there can be no general will either.

Williams's moderate Rousseau is a democrat, but a democrat with respect to sovereignty rather than what Rousseau calls "government". That is to say that for the laws, which bind all the citizens equally, to be legitimate, they must come from all, that all who are subject to the laws must have a say in making them. The application and interpretation of the laws is, however, a matter not for the people as a whole but for the government, composed of magistrates, who are selected by and from the people. This simple picture of universal participation, democratic legitimacy and a division of labor between the sovereign people and their government becomes problematic as soon as we start to press for details. A worry with Williams's reading is that he leaves some of those details unresolved. As he notes, central to any understanding of Rousseau is Geneva, the city of his birth. Geneva was for Rousseau a source of naive patriotic inspiration, in some respects an institutional model, but also, ultimately, his nemesis after the city elders recoiled from the doctrines of the Social Contract. In Rousseau's work there is a constant tension between Geneva as it actually was and the city he may have imagined it to be, with the complicating factor that at least some of his illusions were shared by his compatriots.

In the opening Introduction, Williams records the basic facts about Geneva, that of the population of 25,000 only 1500 were citizens and that these citizens were themselves excluded from effective political power by an oligarchy of a few families who ruled through the Small Council. As he notes, this oligarchy was contested, and there were various attempts to assert the right of the citizens to rule, culminating in disturbances in 1737, which were followed by a new constitutional settlement. As he notes, Rousseau, who was already an exile, was making a rare visit to Geneva during 1737, though Williams does not mention that Rousseau's main reaction seems to have been horror at the bloodshed. Williams describes the struggle of the Genevan citizens as "the quest for a real popular sovereignty", but the difficulty with such a description should be obvious, given the exclusion of the vast majority of residents from citizenship status. The struggle might better be described as one to broaden the base of oligarchy rather than to replace it. When, much later in the book, Williams comes to address the issue of membership in the state, subjection to the law, and democratic participation (163-69, discussing Social Contact 4.2, "Of Suffrage") he notes that foreigners within the state are expected to submit to the sovereignty of the citizen body and that full participation in the formation of the general will is a necessary condition for its uprightness. But this raises the issue of whether all those subject to the law have a claim to citizenship or whether Rousseau's ideal state would mirror Geneva and contain a population of disenfranchised permanently resident aliens. The logic of Rousseau's argument suggests wide inclusion, because only this could ensure that democratic decisions would track the interest of the entire public subjected to the law. Rousseau's own failure to endorse the enfranchisement of the vast majority of Geneva's male population (let alone the women, whom Williams discusses in Appendix B) suggests that "foreigners" might be permanently excluded.

A related issue concerns the balance of power within the state between the sovereign people and the members of the government who exercise executive power on their behalf. As Williams notes, this was a live issue in Geneva at the time, and the Edict of Mediation of 1738 only masked the difficulties by allowing the citizens to pretend to themselves that they were sovereign, whilst retaining effective power in the Small Council. After the Small Council had condemned the Social Contract and he had renounced his citizenship, Rousseau was drawn into internal Genevan politics, an engagement that finds expression in the Letters from the Mountains. One of the key differences between the popular party and the oligarchy was around the right of legislative initiative. In a key passage in Book IV chapter 1 of the Social Contract, Rousseau tantalizingly refers to the "right of voicing an opinion, proposing, dividing, and debating -- which the government always takes care to confine to its own members." But having raised this as an issue, Rousseau fails to make clear whether his remarks are a description of how governments typically act or prescription for how they should act. Williams chooses not to discuss this cryptic passage, which is a pity; if he had done so, it would have been clearer just how democratic his Rousseau is.

Williams makes a number of choices about what to discuss in the Social Contract and various penumbral texts that are worth noting. All are perfectly legitimate, but other commentators have proceeded differently. First, he opts to include a commentary on the chapters in Book Four where Rousseau discusses the institutions of the Roman Republic. Williams views them as important, as shedding light on how Rousseau thought that institutions might preserve the general will, and he makes a plausible case for this. Second, he tacks onto the end of his commentary on the Social Contract an analysis of Rousseau's writings on international relations, in deference to Rousseau's own wish (declared in the final chapter of the book) to look at these questions. Williams bases his analysis on Grace G. Roosevelt's revolutionary reconstruction of Rousseau's "The State of War" and on his critical writings on the Abbé de Saint-Pierre's plan for perpetual peace.[1] This is a useful addition to the main commentary, but it is a pity that Williams did not use the still newer reconstruction, "Principles of the Right of War" by Bruno Bernardi and his collaborators,[2] which supplements and reorganizes the Roosevelt material. Third, Williams opts not to include a systematic discussion of the Genevan MS chapter, "Of the General Society of the Human Race", choosing instead merely to refer to Rousseau's engagement with Diderot in various scattered places through his commentary. This is a pity, since most editions contain this text and it offers a crucial bridge between the Discourse on Inequality and the Social Contract and bears directly on one of Williams's key concerns, the relationship between the general will and impartial morality. Fourth, Williams rather shies away from providing commentary on Rousseau's cryptic mathematical remarks at various points in the text. Rousseau's reference to the "pluses and minuses" in Book 2 Chapter 3 is probably a reference to the infinitesimal calculus, but Williams chooses not to probe this possibility but to put the passage in service of a (very informative) discussion of the contrast between individual will and general will. Williams also opts not to enlighten the reader about Rousseau's curious remarks about quotients and double ratios at the beginning of Book 3. Perhaps he is right to think that they add little to the discussion of the size of government, but some puzzled students will probably want enlightenment as to what is going on there.

In an interesting conclusion to the book, Williams situates Rousseau in relation to a list of precursors and successors. In the former camp are Plato, Machiavelli and Hobbes; in the latter, Kant, Hegel and Rawls. These are perfectly sound choices, though Locke might have been included among the precursors also. Not only does Locke's theory of property influence Rousseau's (as Williams notes), but Rousseau even claimed in the Letters from the Mountains that his own theory was merely an updating of Locke's, a remark that many subsequent readers have thought absurd, but which perhaps merits investigation. There is also a rather large time gap between Hegel and Rawls, suggesting that Rousseau was entirely neglected for a century or so, but this is misleading given his profound influence on Émile Durkheim, on the one hand, and the adaptation of his views on the representation of will by G. D. H. Cole and the guild socialists, on the other.

Ultimately, though, all these points about omissions and lacunae are quibbles about legitimate choices within what is a very good book indeed. As the author of a rival commentary, I would press the case for serious students of Rousseau to have more than one discussion of the Social Contract on their shelves, but David Lay Williams's book sets an impressively high standard in this area. Anyone wishing to decode the mysteries of the general will and to pick apart its ambiguities needs to read it.

[1] Grace G. Roosevelt, Reading Rousseau in a Nuclear Age. Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1990.

[2] Jean-Jacques Rousseau, eds. Bruno Bernardi and Gabriella Silvestrini, Principes du droit de la guerre, Ecrits sur la paix perpetuelle. Paris: Vrin, 2008.