Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Wittgenstein and the Tractatus

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Michael Morris, Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Wittgenstein and the Tractatus, Routledge, 2008, vi+402pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415357227.

Reviewed by Michael Potter, University of Cambridge



‘The Routledge Philosophy GuideBooks painlessly introduce students to the classic works of philosophy.’ Thus the back cover. According to the preface, ‘This book derives ultimately from some lecture handouts which I produced when I first taught the Tractatus in an undergraduate course.’ But the end product does not at all have the character of something derived from lecture handouts. Michael Morris is not very much concerned with providing the kind of smooth summary that most undergraduates (mine, at least) crave. What comes across very clearly is that he is intrigued by the Tractatus and wants to understand it. The effect of this is both good and bad: when what worries him is what worries me too, the result is far more interesting and illuminating than a mere summary, however well crafted, could ever be; when he is worried by something that I do not feel the slightest temptation to think, I find my eye drifting to the point where — yes! — he succeeds in reconciling himself to the view that I thought was obvious all along.

The overall structure of the book follows that of the Tractatus. Morris begins with the metaphysics of the book, says something about Wittgenstein’s Fregean and Russellian background, and goes in some depth into the picture theory (although he usually prefers to translate Bild as ‘model’ rather than ‘picture’). Then he discusses Wittgenstein’s remarks on solipsism before concluding with a chapter (partially derived from an article Morris wrote with Julian Dodd) about the unsayable. The balance between topics strikes me as good, and the general orientation of the book is spot on. On the whole, I found the first few chapters better than the last few.

One of Morris’s favourite methods of exposition is to lay out what he takes to be Wittgenstein’s argument in the form of numbered propositions, and then to introduce his discussion with the words, ‘This is certainly valid, but is it sound?’ I have to confess that whenever I see this sentence, I reach for my revolver. I also think that, quite apart from my sensibilities, it may well not be the best method for students to use when they encounter the Tractatus for the first time, since it often has the effect of highlighting issues that were peripheral to Wittgenstein’s own concerns.

I cannot think of a work worth studying in the history of philosophy that leaves no room at all for dispute over its meaning. In the case of the Tractatus, matters are surely much worse: there is room for legitimate dispute over the interpretation of a great many of its propositions. This leaves the textbook writer with a particular problem. A textbook that simply summarized the possible views would leave the student confused. One that explained exhaustively why all but one of these views is wrong would be quite indigestible. So Morris was probably quite right to decide, in writing his book, to nail his colours to a whole row of interpretative masts. Inevitably, though, this approach offers easy pickings for the critic. I shall mention a few points where I think Morris’s interpretation is mistaken.

The lynchpin of chapter 1 of the book is a discussion of the argument for substance. The crux of this argument1 is Wittgenstein’s claim that ‘if the world had no substance, then whether a proposition had sense would depend on whether another proposition was true’. Morris glosses this as the claim that whether the proposition ‘abcde’ makes sense, for instance, depends on whether the proposition ‘It is possible that abcde’ is true (p. 45). I do not see how this can be the right interpretation, not least because according to the Tractatus ‘It is possible that abcde’ is not a proposition. Of course, that is not something that has emerged by this stage in the Tractatus, but even so, I cannot believe that Wittgenstein’s argument at this point could have had quite so un-Tractarian a flavour. I am also unclear how Morris manages to detach the argument for substance from the assumption that elementary propositions are made up of names so as to be able to present it in the way he does.

I have elsewhere2 suggested that it is a rite of passage for scholars of early analytic philosophy to offer an account of the objection by means of which Wittgenstein paralysed Russell and made him abandon work on his Theory of Knowledge manuscript during the summer of 1913. In chapter 2 Morris submits himself to this rite. His suggestion is that what Wittgenstein disagreed with was Russell’s analysis of the form of a subject-predicate proposition as ‘something has some property’. Wittgenstein certainly did disagree with this, of course, but I rather doubt whether this can be the whole explanation for Russell’s paralysis. At the very least I hope it is not, since it would make the disagreement disappointingly narrow in scope if so. I also find it hard to believe that this difficulty would on its own have led Russell to give up on his manuscript, especially when Wittgenstein had his conception of propositions as facts to offer. It is very likely, of course, that Russell had not yet quite grasped this conception by June 1913, but there is evidence that he had grasped it by the time he gave a lecture course on epistemology at Harvard the following year, and in that course what he mentioned was the difficulty with a theory of judgment that forces the verb of what is judged to occur as a substantive. That, too, is the difficulty he recalled in his logical atomism lectures in London four years later.

My main gripe with chapter 3 is expositional. Morris presents Wittgenstein as having inherited from Frege and Russell an objectivity assumption that he phrases as follows:

The extra-linguistic items with which linguistic items have to be correlated for languages to be meaningful are items in the world (objects). (p. 114)

I suspect that many students will be confused about how this assumption applies to Frege. They might well be tempted to think that for him the extra-linguistic items required for meaningfulness lie not in the world but in the third realm of sense. The point, as eventually emerges in Morris’s discussion, is that in Frege’s case we need to read ‘meaningful’ in the technical sense of ‘having reference’, and not in anything like the informal sense of ‘making sense’. Since Morris himself uses ‘meaningful’ in the informal sense elsewhere, the phrasing is unfortunate.

Morris entitles his chapter on the picture theory ‘Sentences as models’. This title indicates not only his preference, already mentioned, for translating Bild as model, but also his tendency to treat the picture theory as applying to sentences. Wittgenstein’s claim, he says, ‘is that the analysis of models which he provides in the 2.1s and 2.2s applies completely straightforwardly and literally to sentences — or, at least, to certain basic sentences’ (p. 145). I suspect that this could mislead some students: they might be tempted to think of the picture theory as applying ‘completely straightforwardly and literally’ to the sentences of ordinary language; that, surely, would be a short route to madness. Wittgenstein made the distinction between propositional signs and propositions partly in order to distance the proposition from the sentence we use to express it. There are very few places in the Tractatus, I think, where translating Satz as ‘sentence’ is not potentially misleading. Even in the case of the ‘basic sentences’ to which Morris limits his claim, I think students will struggle if they try to think of the picture theory as applying to sentences in anything like the ordinary sense.

Morris presents Wittgenstein as holding that ‘in principle, and ideally, a symbol can be introduced in advance of any assignment of meaning’ and that ‘symbols in general, and therefore propositions … in particular, are defined by their syntax, independently of their meaning’ (pp. 165, 166). I think that this is wrong: I think Wittgenstein’s view was that it makes no sense to separate syntax from meaning in this manner. Further, I also think, for reasons it would take too long to explain here, that Morris is wrong to present the picture theory as applying only to elementary propositions.

Morris’s treatment of the extensionality of the Tractatus makes the view seem so wildly implausible that it becomes puzzling why Wittgenstein might ever have held it. Indeed Morris moves swiftly from the fact that ‘A believes that p’ is not a truth-function of p to the conclusion that this expression is ‘really just malformed, and … not meaningful at all’. That, Morris thinks, ‘really is not credible’ (p. 258). I am not as sure of the incredibility as Morris is. It all hinges on what kind of malformation is in question. Wittgenstein certainly thought that whatever is not a truth-function of elementary propositions is not a genuine proposition, and hence that logic properly speaking does not apply to it, but that is not in itself wholly incredible. One would need to say more about the status of such quasi-propositions in order to judge how credible it is that ‘A believes that p’ might be one of them.

An analogous difficulty infects Morris’s attempt to present the logical independence of elementary propositions as a direct consequence of extensionality: if ‘p depends on q’ were a truth-function of p and q, its truth value would depend only on the truth values of p and q, and hence it would be trivial (p. 260). Quite so, but Morris does not consider the possibility that ‘p depends on q’ might be unsayable (as, for instance, ‘p entails p v q’ is).

I have dwelt here on what I regard as mistakes in Morris’s reading of the Tractatus partly to emphasize to scholars not about to teach a course on it that this book nonetheless deserves their attention, and partly so that those who are about to lecture on it and are thinking of using Morris as their course text can judge for themselves how much these mistakes (if that is what they are) matter.

This is certainly not an easy book. It is not, for instance, the book I would tell students to read during the vacation in preparation for a course on the Tractatus: that, for me, remains Anthony Kenny’s excellent introduction.3 I would also be hesitant about using it as the only text for a course: I would want my students to read other books as well. But I would certainly want my students to read some of the careful analysis of Wittgenstein’s picture theory and metaphysics that Morris offers. Perhaps I would put chapters 1-4 on my reading list, excluding sections 1D, 2E, 3E and 4C.

My reservations notwithstanding, I think this is one of the best books about the Tractatus that I have read. It is not right about everything, but it gets more right than most. It is suffused with a sort of sceptical enthusiasm for the Tractatus which seems to me to be just the right attitude to encourage in students coming to this frustratingly fascinating work for the first time. I recommend it.

1 Tractatus, 2.0211.

2 Wittgenstein’s Notes on Logic (OUP, 2009), p. 118.

3 Wittgenstein, revised ed. (Wiley-Blackwell, 2005).