Russell and Wittgenstein on the Nature of Judgement

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Rosalind Carey, Russell and Wittgenstein on the Nature of Judgement, Continuum, 2007, 150pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826488114.

Reviewed by Maria van der Schaar, Leiden University


In 1913 Russell worked on a manuscript called Theory of Knowledge which became well known when it appeared as volume 7 of The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell in 1984. Russell's aim in the manuscript was to provide an epistemological counterpart to the Principia. He started writing on the 7th of May; in mid-June he stopped, having been 'paralysed' by criticism Wittgenstein presented at several meetings while Russell was working on the manuscript.

In her book, Rosalind Carey asks: Why did Russell abandon the manuscript? The aim of her book is to give a reconstruction of Wittgenstein's criticism and of Russell's responses to his objections. We do not have any direct record of those objections which, along with Russell's answers, have to be reconstructed from a variety of sources:  from their correspondence shortly before and after their meetings, from Wittgenstein's 'Notes on Logic' (September 1913), from Russell's letters to lady Ottoline Morrell, from the development in the manuscript itself, from notes and diagrams Russell composed when he was working on the manuscript, from Russell's unpublished notes called 'What is Logic?' (1912), and from Russell's writings published between 1910 and 1918.

According to Peter Hanks, in an article that appeared in Synthese in 2007, the reason that Russell abandoned the manuscript stems from Russell's multiple relation theory of judgement, which is not able to account for the unity of the proposition. Carey argues that this cannot be the reason Russell abandoned the manuscript since he developed new versions of the multiple relation theory of judgement after 1913. According to Carey, Russell’s problem is that Wittgenstein "has shown him the existence of a hitherto unknown form -- one with two relations -- and that he, Russell, has no idea how to explain how facts of that form are true, or how they are connected to other, more complicated forms" (Carey, p. 112). What Wittgenstein is supposed to point at is the form of belief and the bipolarity of the proposition.

Because Carey devotes a complete book to the topic, she is able to give a broad analysis of the aims of Theory of Knowledge, and the multiple relation theory of judgement. In the first chapter of her book, she points to an interesting connection between Russell's theory of judgement and his theory of denoting from 1905. That-clauses, according to Russell, are incomplete symbols, and therefore do not denote propositions as single entities. Only through an act of judgement can that-clauses obtain a meaning. The study of propositions is thus relocated within a theory of mind and knowledge (Carey, p. 16). By abandoning a Meinongian theory of propositions, Russell is no longer committed to the acknowledgement of objective falsehoods. In case a sentence is true, there is an objective complex; if the sentence is false, there is no such complex. Carey argues that Russell is primarily motivated to abandon a theory of propositions, because of the logical and epistemological paradoxes that are entailed by such a theory. One may add that concerning the question whether there are only objective truths, or both objective truths and falsehoods, philosophers can be divided into those whose primary aim is to guarantee the objectivity of knowledge, and those who aim to guarantee the objectivity of logic and semantics: Wittgenstein and Frege belong to the latter type, acknowledging both objective truths and falsehoods; Lotze, the Neo-Kantians, and Russell belong to the first type, being in need only of objective truths, which Russell calls complexes. It is thus clear that Wittgenstein and Russell differ fundamentally concerning the relation between logic and epistemology. For Wittgenstein, questions concerning logic and the possibility of depiction are prior to all other philosophical questions. The development in Theory of Knowledge can be seen as an attempt by Russell to account for the objectivity of logic, thereby answering Wittgenstein's criticism, without acknowledging the objectivity of falsehoods. From this perspective it comes as no surprise that Russell fails in the end.

Carey makes clear the problem for which Russell is trying to find an answer in the manuscript. In the judgement that Desdemona loves Cassio, we cannot assume that there is a unity of Desdemona, loving and Cassio in the outer world, for that would make all our judgements true. In the 1912 version of the multiple relation theory, Russell thought that the act of judging relates the different objects Desdemona, loving and Cassio. This theory still makes it impossible to judge falsely. In 1913, Russell aims to answer this problem by the introduction of the notion of form.

In the second chapter, Carey gives a reconstruction of the conversation on 20 May, and shows what influence the discussion had on the last chapters of part I of Theory of Knowledge (TK), dealing with acquaintance of relations and that of logical form. These chapters are important, because they are a prelude to the problem of the unity of the proposition in part II. All 'mental synthesis' involves acquaintance with logical form, Russell concludes (TK, p. 101). Carey contrasts Russell's conception of logic with Wittgenstein's, presenting Russell as defending the thesis that logical form is obtained by a psychological process of abstraction. Russell, though, distinguishes this psychological, epistemic order of things from the logical order: "The understanding of a pure form, is … a logically simpler fact than the understanding of a proposition which is an instance of the form" (TK, p. 132). Russell clearly distinguishes between the order of knowledge and the logical order; the cognitive, psychological process of abstraction that starts from concrete propositions is logically irrelevant.

I think Carey is right, when she says that Wittgenstein reacted to the 1912 version of the multiple relation theory (the one in Problems of Philosophy), which makes the act of judgement central to the account of the unity of the proposition. Wittgenstein's objections to this theory must have been: how can you explain the objectivity of the logical notion of proposition, if you make it dependent upon a subjective act; and how can Russell explain that we can understand propositions that are false? For if the act of judgement really unifies the terms, we can only judge facts. Part of Russell's answer is to introduce the notion of an act of understanding that is presupposed in every judgement. Carey says that Russell here "rejects Meinong's doctrine of assumptions as a state of mind involving assertion and denial" (Carey, p. 64). I think, though, that Meinong has had an important influence on Russell regarding the notion of understanding. First, saying that assumptions involve assertion and denial, as Carey does, is misleading here. For Meinong, a complex such as a proposition (Objektiv) cannot be apprehended by a simple act of presentation; it is apprehended by an act of assumption, which has the bipolarity that we know from judgement. In contrast to presentations, judgements and assumptions are positive or negative. Assumption is distinguished from judgement in that it is not accompanied by conviction; no commitment is made in the act of assumption. Russell's thesis that the act of understanding is somehow in between that of acquaintance and judgement, and his thesis that understanding is presupposed in all judgement, is typically Meinongian. Russell himself admits the affinity (TK, p. 108). The reason I stress the Meinongian influence on Russell in the manuscript, is that it is striking to what extent one may find Meinongian ideas in the Tractatus. It is most likely that Wittgenstein got these ideas from Russell. This thesis makes sense only if Russell is still defending Meinongian ideas during the time he was discussing his ideas with Wittgenstein.

In the third chapter of her book, Carey deals with the second meeting between Russell and Wittgenstein on the 26th of May, in which the notion of form is discussed. In response to Wittgenstein's first objection that Russell cannot account for the objectivity and unity of the proposition, Russell tries to account for them by introducing an objective notion of form, the bipolarity of the proposition (something that Wittgenstein himself stressed). Wittgenstein must have been dissatisfied by this attempt, and it seems that Russell is simply not able to answer Wittgenstein's criticism, because of both his atomistic theory of meaning and his denial of internal relations. It is not difficult to imagine that Russell's failure has had some influence on the importance of internal relations, and on the idea, in the Tractatus, that a sentence is more than a collection of terms. Carey makes an important observation concerning Russell's ideas on what makes a belief true when she points out that: "His failure to show that the belief and what makes it true are related essentially" (Carey, p. 84). It is not difficult to see this as a consequence of Russell's rejection of internal relations. Carey shows that these problems, and the way they are connected to problems with the special form of belief, lead Russell to abandon the manuscript.

In the fourth (and last) chapter Carey, pursuing her central question, why Russell has abandoned the manuscript, asks: "what about his attempt to do justice to the bipolarity of a proposition leads him to abandon the Theory of Knowledge and yet doesn't lead him to reject his theory of judgement?" (Carey, p. 95). Russell's notes on propositions, headed 'Props', edited in the Collected Papers (volume 7, pp. 194-199), play an important role in Carey's argument that Russell did not decide to abandon the manuscript because of Wittgenstein's letter written in June. According to Carey, the date of these notes is sometime shortly after the 26th of May. In the notes, Russell understands that form as a separate constituent of judgement cannot do the unifying work it is supposed to do. In order to account for Wittgenstein's point that propositions are objective and independent of a judging subject, and that propositions are unique in having a bipolarity of truth and falsity, Russell leaves the notion of form, and introduces the notion of a neutral fact instead. The neutral fact is a constituent of the positive or negative fact. Judgement, according to Russell, involves the neutral fact, not the positive or negative fact, and it asserts one of the latter. It is now possible for a judgement to have content, although what it asserts is not actual. According to Carey (p. 102), the notes suggest that Russell is beginning to be aware of the problem that belief is a form of fact wholly unlike others, and that an explanation of propositions is needed which does not depend on the notion of a judging or understanding subject. In the end, Russell is not able to capture propositional bipolarity and the essential connection between the proposition's sense and the fact that verifies it, and abandons the manuscript. Carey's thesis is interesting and original. Throughout the book, Carey argues against the interpretation given by Hanks that I have discussed above, and I think her argument is in this respect convincing. She also argues against the standard interpretation given by Sommerville and Griffin that Wittgenstein's argument against Russell's Theory of Knowledge primarily concerns the point that Russell cannot explain that non-sense cannot be judged; this standard interpretation sees "the demise of the theory of knowledge as turning on issues of logical type" (Carey, p. 110). Her argument against the standard interpretation, though, overlooks the last sentence of Russell's notes on propositions: "There will only be a neutral fact when the objects are of the right types. This introduces great difficulties" (Coll. Papers, 7, p. 199). It thus seems that problems surrounding types and the impossibility of judging non-sense did play a role in Russell's abandoning the manuscript after all. Although Wittgenstein was not able to clearly formulate the point in May and June, Russell seems to have understood the gist of Wittgenstein’s criticism that was formulated much more clearly in Tractatus 5.5422 and in the Notes on Logic, written down in September 1913.

A few errata:  In the Russellian diagram on page 65, S should stand for the subject, not A. The quote from Russell's notes on page 100 is lacking a negation-sign that should be inserted before the free-standing (xRy) in the quote at the top of the page.

It is a pity that Russell's notes, which play such an important role in Carey's argument, are printed so badly in the book (I could not read them without the help of the print in the Collected Papers).

I recommend the book to anyone interested in the development of Russell's thoughts between 1910 and 1918, and in Russell's relation with Wittgenstein.