Russell's Philosophy of Logical Analysis: 1897-1905

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Jolen Galaugher, Russell's Philosophy of Logical Analysis: 1897-1905, Palgrave Macmillan, 2013, 218pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137302069.

Reviewed by Russell Wahl, Idaho State University


There has been a revival of work on Russell in the last few years, but most of it has focused on Russell's theory of descriptions, his theory of knowledge, or the logic of Principia Mathematica. Jolen Galaugher's book, on the other hand, focuses on an earlier period, a period that has not been so extensively discussed since Nicholas Griffin's 1991 Russell's Idealist Apprenticeship. Galaugher's focus is on Russell's work from the last days of his idealism to the development of his 1905 theory of denoting. Her unifying theme is Russell's approach to analysis. Galaugher sees Russell as committed to what Michael Beaney calls "decompositional analysis," the understanding of a complex by clarifying its constituents and their relations. She sees this understanding of analysis as deeply associated with his commitment to metaphysical pluralism and his account of relations. Galaugher does not spend much time arguing that Russell adopted this kind of analysis, as this is not controversial. She rather focuses on the various manifestations of Russell's analysis and argues that it is the commitment to this kind of analysis that explains in several cases why Russell's philosophy developed as it did. While this is the overall theme, the book also contains rich analyses of various details of Russell's views independent of it. The theme is especially prominent in the last two chapters.

Galaugher begins with Russell's break with idealism and his adoption of metaphysical pluralism. Her highly detailed discussion of the doctrine of internal relations focuses in the end on whether Russell's rejection of internal relations stems from G. E. Moore's influence or rather from his own work on Leibniz. Russell at times mentions both influences. Galaugher, after much discussion, sees each of them as important, but suggests that it was his work on Leibniz that led Russell to his own account of external relations (p. 67) and that Russell's intensional view of relations was a product of his commitment to decompositional analysis. In her discussion of these issues Galaugher gives a detailed exposition of Russell's views in these early works. Students of this period of Russell's work will benefit from her complex exposition.

Galaugher then tackles Russell's logicism. Part of her concern is to reject the interpretation, made popular by Alberto Coffa and others, of Russell's "if-thenism"; another part is to set the stage for contrasting Frege and Russell. The discussion of logicism in the third chapter is very thorough, and Galaugher gives an interesting account of the development of logicism in Russell's writings, both published and unpublished, during the crucial years, 1900 and 1903.

In the fourth chapter, on Frege and Russell, we see the overall theme of decompositional analysis. There is a close relation between Russell's and Frege's definitions of number, and both of them saw this relation and emphasized the similarities. There were also differences of ontology between them, and again, they were both aware of this. While recognizing the similarities, Galaugher wants to emphasize the differences (p. 123). While much of her discussion focuses on the contradiction and how it affects both Russell's and Frege's attempts to develop a theory of classes as objects rather than collections of objects, ultimately Galaugher wants to emphasize the difference between the two because she sees Russell's project as driven by his commitment to decompositional analysis. It is for this reason, she thinks, that Russell must reject Frege's functional analysis for his own view of propositional functions, where the arguments of the functions and the functions themselves are constituents of the values of the functions, that is, of the propositions.

In her final chapter, Galaugher argues that Russell's earlier denoting concepts from Principles of Mathematics and the 1903-4 manuscripts were ultimately at odds with his view of analysis. These functions, like Frege's, did not include their arguments in their values. Ultimately she sees the argument against the old theory of denoting, which occurs in "On Fundamentals" and in revised form in "On Denoting," as stemming from Russell's commitment to the claim that any entity can occur as one of a logical subject of a proposition, which she connects to Russell's decompositional theory of analysis (p. 168).

Galaugher is surely right that there is a connection between Russell's method of analysis and his commitment to metaphysical pluralism. As Nino Cocchiarella and Gregory Landini have pointed out, Russell was strongly committed to the unrestricted variable as well. While Russell holds to these commitments, during the period with which Galaugher is dealing there is a spirit of experiment in Russell's work as he tries to find a system that will solve the contradiction. At times Russell appears to be ready to jettison some of his commitments if so doing would supply a solution to the problem of the contradictions. For example, he was willing to entertain different styles of variables ("meaning variables" and "entity variables") when trying to solve the contradictions, and as Galaugher herself points out, Russell during the 1904-5 period was interested in taking the idea of denoting functions (similar to Frege's functions) as fundamental. There is an interesting and important passage in the paper "On the Meaning and Denotation of Phrases," quoted in part on p. 163 of Galaugher's book, where Russell reflected on taking denoting functions or propositional functions as fundamental.

In the end, Russell did adopt the view that relational propositions rather than denoting concepts are fundamental, but his discussion seems to leave open the other alternative and does not suggest that the view of analysis Galaugher sees as paramount should be the deciding factor. A reader of the long passages in "On Fundamentals" where Russell outlines his difficulties with his theory of denoting complexes will also sense that Russell was experimenting with options and eventually getting frustrated with all the different kinds of occurrences he would need to allow. Galaugher's discussion of "On Fundamentals" (pp. 167-171) is interspersed with discussions of several other works, both earlier and later, and does not give a good picture of this sense of experiment. It is somewhat easier, then, for her to connect what is going on there with her theme concerning analysis (p. 171).

There were ontological differences between Frege and Russell. Galaugher wants to emphasize these differences, but she does not do enough to make clear Russell's own ontology, especially with regard to propositional functions. There are on-going debates in the literature as to the status of propositional functions in Russell's ontology. While most agree that Russell sought to eliminate them during his experiment with his "substitution theory" of classes and relations, there is no clear agreement about their status in other works. Galaugher sidesteps these issues. Even when talking about Russell's 1906 substitution theory, she wants to state that propositional functions are more fundamental to Russell's theory (p. 141), even after just having acknowledged that Russell held at this time that they, along with classes and relations, are mere façons de parler (p. 140).

Galaugher has profited from being at the Russell Archives and makes extensive use of Russell's letters and the material collected in the lesser-known Volumes 2 and 3 of the Collected Papers. The strongest parts of the book are the detailed discussions of the particular views Russell had as his views evolved over time. In addition to these papers she has made extensive use of the Couturat-Russell correspondence.

The material Galaugher covers is difficult. But her presentation does not make it easier. Long paragraphs with sometimes convoluted sentences make the difficult material even more challenging. There is much detailed analysis, but it is at times easy to get lost. A certain amount of editing and revision, as well as some stricter proofreading, would have improved the work greatly. Nonetheless, it is a work that scholars of Russell's early work will need to take seriously.