Saving God: Religion After Idolatry

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Mark Johnston, Saving God: Religion After Idolatry, Princeton UP, 2009, xi + 198 pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691143941.

Reviewed by Lynne Rudder Baker, University of Massachusetts Amherst



Saving God is a rich and provocative book. It aims to “save God” from idolatrous believers, who take God to be largely concerned with the welfare and destiny of human creatures. Banning idolatry, Johnston is led to a panentheistic conception of “the Highest One,” who (or which) is not separable from Nature. With echoes of Spinoza and, to a lesser extent, Whitehead, Johnston takes Supernaturalism to be spiritually irrelevant, as well as idolatrous.1

Idolatry is a very broad category for Johnston. It includes supernaturalism as well as superstition (p. 40), worship of false gods and graven images (p. 19, p. 21), perverse worship and projection of our own desires onto the object of worship (p. 20), servility to another’s will (p. 24), “anthropomorphic accretions of this or that historic faith” onto the Highest One (p. 99), “hope for a Cosmic Intervener who might confer special worldly advantages on his favorites,” (p.158) and more.

Neither a work of philosophy nor of academic theology, Saving God is “offered as the expression of a certain sensibility” (xi). The sensibility is one of a confirmed naturalist (the natural world as “causally complete and self-contained” [p. 48]) who has serious religious impulses. The natural world is all that there is, but understood properly, it can be seen as “the site of the sacred” (p. 187).

The path to this conclusion is fascinating. I’ll summarize it in the following paragraphs. ‘God’ is seen to be a descriptive name that abbreviates ‘the Highest One.’ “[I]f there is a Highest One,” Johnston claims, “it deserves our fealty, not arbitrarily, but because of its perfections” (p. 95). Is the object of worship of any of the three monotheisms the Highest One? Well, perhaps not. Judaism, Christianity, and Islam are all idolatrous insofar as they attempt “to evade or ignore the demanding core of true religion: radical self-abandonment to the Divine as manifested in the turn toward others and toward objective reality” (p. 24). They are idolatrous insofar as they invoke another hidden world and promise an afterlife in that world, as a way of redirecting people’s aspirations in the “all too this-worldly interests of the religion” (p. 24).

Using a “phenomenological” method, Saving God aims to investigate what the Highest One would be like if it existed. For a religious experience to be an experience of the Highest One, "the beneficiary of a revelation must see or hear the events as the Highest One manifesting himself. That content must be internal to the experience and not just to the subsequent beliefs that it prompts" (p. 68). This requires some antecedent concept of what would and would not count as the Highest One. (You could not see a table as a snooker table unless you have some idea of what a snooker table is.) Then, bracketing the question of the existence of the Highest One, we can ask: if this foundational revelatory experience were veridical, would it be a revelation of the Highest One? Does it “display the character of the Highest One?” (pp. 34-5; 36)

With a myriad of examples from the three monotheisms, Johnston gives a negative answer. These religions “degrade their putative experience of Divinity by entirely wedding it to the passing and adventitious world views of their founding fathers” (p. 39). But the real problem is that the monotheisms’ conception of “God as essentially a supernatural being” is already idolatrous (p. 39). Johnston characterizes supernaturalism as “belief in invisible spiritual agencies whose putative interventions would violate the laws of nature, at least as those laws are presently understood” (p. 40). He associates supernaturalism with the “spiritual materialism” of consumerists who take up a hobby of self-improvement, without any fundamental change in their lives (p. 14; p. 40).

So, we should eschew supernaturalism for “legitimate naturalism,” which “arises out of proper respect for the methods and achievements of science” (p. 43). Legitimate naturalism is not scientism. Scientism is the view that only the natural realm exists, whereas

[l]egitimate naturalism is the view that the domain of the natural sciences is complete on its own terms: every causal transaction ultimately consists in some utter natural process, for example, mass-energy transfer. There are no gods of the gaps. (p. 127)

Indeed, those who espouse “true religion” should hope that the ontological naturalism thesis is true, “[f]or ontological naturalism would be a complete defense against the supernatural powers and principalities that could otherwise exploit our tendency to servile idolatry and spiritual materialism” (p. 51). We would be insulated from servitude to any supernatural beings.

From this naturalistic viewpoint, we can get to a kind of “substantive reasonableness” that allows us to appreciate the force of reasons that goes beyond the force of pure logic or decision theory (p. 80). We can think of God ethically as "Logos gradually disclosing the requirements of substantive reasonableness." But then why do we need to invoke God at all?

Well, we are fallen creatures. Original sin comes with being human: we “are by our natures caught in an oscillation between self-will and false righteousness” (p. 88). (Johnston gives a fascinating naturalistic account of the Fall [pp. 82-8].) We are curved in on ourselves, as Luther said and Kant agreed, by our self-love.

We cannot achieve a truly ethical life by our own efforts. The life of ordinary virtue is not “the truly ethical life,” in which you regard all other people as on a par with yourself and treat their interests as on a par with yours (p. 90). The only thing that can set us right is to be seized by “grace” (p. 81). "Are not the sources of redemptive katalepsis, or grace," Johnston asks, “many and various?” (pp. 93-4) And if the various forms of grace have a common source in the Highest One, then “the Highest One is more than the monotheisms have allowed” (p. 82). So, how are we to understand the Highest One?

In the first place, the Highest One has all perfections (but we may not know what those perfections are). In the second place, the Highest One could not have created anything distinct from itself. If it had, then the perfections of the Highest One would be reflected in the separate creation. In that case, the “joint reality made up of the Highest One and the separate creation” would be a more appropriate object of worship than the Highest One alone. But only the Highest One deserves worship. So there is no separate creation. Creatures are only manifestations of the Highest One. Johnston explains, “[w]hat is called creation is some part or aspect or principle or mode of the Highest One. That is why a worshipful attitude to the whole of reality is not idolatrous” (p. 95).

According to Johnston, Aquinas took God to be Existence Itself — something like a Platonic Form (p. 99). God is the source of all reality and cannot be ontologically dependent on anything else. This view, coupled with Aquinas’s idea that a composite thing is dependent on its components, leads to what Johnston calls ‘the identity theory of God’s nature.’ God cannot have attributes like Goodness, Justice, etc.; God must be his properties. God is identical to his attributes, which are identical to each other. So, God is a single attribute — not part of monotheism at all (p. 103).

Moreover, the identity theory of God’s nature is at odds with Aquinas’s account of analogical predication. And if divine predication is equivocal, we get a paradox of the Highest One:

Any differentiated knowledge of the Highest One’s nature will imply that this nature is complex, so that the Highest One is not a se, and so not the First in the order of being, and so is not, in fact, the Highest One.

The way out of this paradox is to note that “[n]ot every whole made up of distinct parts is ontologically subordinate to those parts. For the parts may themselves essentially depend on the whole they make up” (p. 110). So God, the First Being, can be complex.

If complexity can enter into the nature of the Highest One, we can compare two alternative identifications, the Thomistic one and the panentheistic one:

The Highest One = Existence Itself

The Highest One = the outpouring of Existence Itself by way of its exemplification in ordinary existents

On the Thomistic identification, according to which the Highest One is Being, “the analogical basis for describing Existence Itself as Love does not lie in the essential nature of the Highest One.” But on the panentheistic identification, the Highest One is not Being (nor is it an ordinary existent); it is a kind of activity that could be analogically described as Loving. On this second identification, the Highest One is “Being’s Self-Giving” (p. 113).

Johnston argues that the panentheistic identification, combined with a view of analogical predication, can skirt problems that afflict traditional theism, such as the problem of unnecessary evil. The problem of unnecessary evil “arises only with a conception of Divine Goodness that expresses the idolatrous longing for a useful god, one who will favor us with something other than his own self-revelation” (p. 115).

This suggests another way that Johnston distinguishes his view from classical theism (p. 157). The three monotheisms would say something like this:

“The outpouring of Being by way of its exemplification in ordinary existents is for the sake of self-disclosure of Being to us.”

Johnston’s panentheist would say this instead:

“The outpouring of Being by way of its exemplification in ordinary existents is for the sake of self-disclosure of Being.”

Full-stop. Here, I think, we see Johnston’s idea of the root of idolatry: we are so self-centered that we suppose that the Highest One is focused on us.

Johnston, citing Heidegger, takes the natural realm to be Being-making-itself-present. Presence is disclosure, regarded as a kind of truth (p. 129). He emphasizes that we are not Producers of Presence, but Samplers of Presence. “Being is by its nature present; Being’s fundamental activity is self-disclosure,” he writes (p. 132). All possible modes of presentation are objectively there in the world, and we have evolved to access some of them. The idea that we are Samplers of Presence — and hence that our mental states, constituted by brain states, can be about things that exist independently of those states — has been obscured by representational theories of mind. I think that Johnston does a wonderful job of motivating and describing an alternative to representationalism (pp. 129-151).

In keeping with the unusual genre of Saving God, I’ll spend the remainder of this review simply saying how some of Johnston’s views strike me.

(1) Johnston distinguishes his process panentheism from pantheism that identifies God and nature. In contrast to the pantheist,

the panentheist will assert that God is partly constituted by the natural realm, in the sense that his activity is manifest in and through natural processes alone. But his reality goes beyond what is captured by the purely scientific description of all the events that make up the natural realm. (p. 119)

However, since pantheism and panentheism “share the same ontology,” I wonder how the reality of God can go beyond the purely scientific description of all the events that make up the natural realm (p. 126). I see how descriptions (analogical, of course) of God can go beyond scientific descriptions, but I do not see how panentheism can allow any reality to go beyond what can be disclosed by science. This worry is acute with respect to the ontological status of Presence and all the objective modes of presentation.

(2) Sometimes, Johnston says, "God is partly constituted by the natural realm"; later, Johnston says that "God is wholly constituted by the natural realm" (p. 127). In any case, what does it mean to say that the natural realm constitutes God (partly or wholly)? Two worries come to mind: (i) If ‘Nature’ and ‘God’ are just two ways of designating the same thing, Reality, then Nature and God are identical and pantheism is true. (ii) Although Johnston insists on the nonidentity of Nature and God (God is “distinct” from what constitutes God), the natural world is causally closed under natural law; thus, it is difficult to see how God is anything at all — except perhaps an epiphenomenon.

(3) Although I am no theologian, I have doubts about some of Johnston’s descriptions of Christian theology — e.g., that Aquinas conceived of God as a (nonpersonal) Platonic Form, Existence Itself, or that Christians think of an afterlife as a reward for a virtuous life in this world. (Johnston says: “Belief in the afterlife as a reward for faithfulness is either an idolatrous conceit or evidence of a failure to assimilate the radical nature of Christ’s new dispensation” [p. 183]. Of course, Christians do not take an afterlife to be a reward for faithfulness.)

(4) It seems to me that the doctrine of analogy is stretched beyond its limits when Johnston says: The Love of the Highest One

is analogized as its outpouring in ordinary existents, its Will as self-disclosure, its Mind as the most revealing presentations found in the realm of sense, and its Power as the totality of the laws of nature. In these respects, the Highest One has by analogy the characteristics of a person, but a person far removed from ordinary personality. (p. 158)

This seems to me like saying, “The National Football League has by analogy the characteristics of a penguin, but a penguin far removed from ordinary penguinity.”

(5) Johnston says illuminatingly: “What is really bad, what could render one’s life shameful or even not worth living, occurs when that conception of the good is shallow or perverted or confused.” Fine, but then he continues: “If God takes hold of us, then we will be safe from this. If he does not, then one’s conception of the good will remain unredeemed” (p. 179). How does it make even analogical sense to say of a panentheistic God, who has no independent causal powers, that he “takes hold of us”?

(6) What Johnston calls ‘legitimate naturalism’ is that “the domain of the natural sciences is complete on its own terms” (p. 127). It is simply the naturalism that expresses “proper respect for the methods and achievements of science” (p. 43, p. 127). These characterizations are far from equivalent: a classical theist could agree with everything that Johnston says about the methods and achievements of science, without agreeing that the domain of the natural sciences is “complete on its own terms” (however that is interpreted).

(7) Johnston says that the Highest One, to be of salvific interest, must be a unity that embraces the diversity of polytheism (p. 94). But he gives no reason to think this. Classical theists can agree with him that Kant’s idea of moral law cannot save us; in trying to follow it, we are still mired in our self-deceiving self-wills. Nevertheless all that follows is that we can’t become less turned in on ourselves by our own efforts — but, of course, that’s what Christianity holds.

(8) “The choice between classical theism and panentheism,” Johnston says,

is if you like a choice between a first principle and the expressive activity of that first principle. The latter is the more inclusive object of worship, for it includes not only the serene perfections of Existence Itself, but the perfections inherent in its universal act of outpouring and self-disclosure. In that sense, panentheism appears to provide a more suitable theological description of the Highest One. (p. 120)

I wonder. As a matter of logic, it seems that the first principle is a precondition for its (its) expressive activity. Its expressive activity can’t be superior to what has the expressive activity. And I don’t see why either a first principle or its expressive activity should be (or could be) an object of worship.

(9) Johnston suggests that the structure of presence may impose evolutionary constraints. He mentions “the antecedent structure of the limited variety of modes of presentation that can in principle be accessed by the variety of neural systems that might get going in that environment” (p. 153). But how can there be an antecedent structure of modes of presentation? The modes of presentation which show me that you are overjoyed, or are grief-stricken, or are embarrassed or jealous could not have existed before there were beings who are overjoyed, or grief-stricken or embarrassed or jealous. There could not be an “antecedent structure of the limited variety of modes of presentation that can in principle be accessed by the variety of neural systems that might get going” in the environment, for this reason: however objective the modes of presentation are, they themselves are ontologically dependent on the existents that present them.

(10) Johnston says, rightly in my opinion, that there is no soul [or self] existing separately from our brains and bodies (p. 184). But it does not follow that our personal identity over time "is actually secured by certain patterns of personal identification with what then become our future selves" (p. 184). Is your taking some future (imagined) person to be yourself the same as her being yourself? Being yourself over time can be secured by the continued exemplification of your first-person perspective. You do not need a separately existing soul or self.

Despite these worries and disagreements, I found Saving God to be original, complex and insightful. (See, for example, Johnston’s well-founded hostility to “ready-to-wear righteousness” [p. 172].) However one reacts to Johnston’s naturalistic reinterpretation of Christianity and the other monotheisms, one may still applaud his rejection of idolatrous uses of religion to serve human ends.

1 Saving God is to have a companion volume, Surviving Death, based on Johnston’s Hempel lectures. Surviving Death promises to be a philosophical defense of the spiritual irrelevance of supernaturalism.