Science, Policy, and the Value-Free Ideal

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Heather E. Douglas, Science, Policy, and the Value-Free Ideal, U. of Pittsburgh Press, 2009, 210pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822960263.

Reviewed by Melinda Bonnie Fagan, Rice University



Science is our best means to knowledge about the natural world, and so our policies should be informed by scientific results. Science, Policy, and the Value-Free Ideal examines the implications of this truism, focusing on the role of science in policymaking. To fulfill its advisory role, science must be insulated from the political, ethical and social considerations that pervade policymaking. It thus seems to follow that such values should be excluded from scientific reasoning, that “value judgments internal to science, involving the evaluation and acceptance of scientific results at the heart of the research process, are to be as free as humanly possible of all social and ethical values” (45). Yet in the policy domain, this ideal of “value-free science” has saddled us with panoplies of dueling experts on opposite sides of vital issues, muddying the distinction between “sound science” and “junk science” and placing the role of science in society under strain. To remedy this situation, Douglas proposes a new ideal, which allows ethical and social values a legitimate role throughout the research process while preserving scientific integrity and objectivity. Science, she argues, should not be value-free, but “saturated” with ethical, social, and cognitive values.

Science, Policy, and the Value-Free Ideal is aimed at a broad audience of philosophers of science, scientists, and policymakers (ix-x). It advocates an ambitious reorientation of philosophy of science, taking the role of science in society as basic. Douglas’s focus on policymaking is timely, and her argument is illustrated throughout with many real-life examples from that domain. The book is clearly organized: after an introductory chapter, Douglas first argues against the ideal of value-free science (Chapters 2-4), and then defends her value-laden alternative (Chapters 5-6). The final chapters examine the implications of this new ideal for science in policymaking (Chapter 7-8). The writing throughout is clear and free of jargon, though the details of policy history sometimes bristle with acronyms. The book (or portions thereof) would be suitable for graduate or advanced undergraduate courses in philosophy of science, or science and policy.

The argument begins with historical overviews of science advising in the US (Chapter 2) and the origins of the value-free ideal (Chapter 3). These chapters set the stage for what follows, explicating the role of the science advisor and introducing 1950s debates over the role of values in evidential assessment. They also undercut the motivation for the value-free ideal. While the institutional history reveals an expanded role for science advisors in policymaking after WWII, history of philosophy of science reveals entrenchment of the value-free ideal and the “isolationist” view of science on which it depends. Acceptance of the value-free ideal, Douglas claims, was due not to decisive philosophical argument, but to a combination of pressure from Cold War politics, the need to consolidate philosophy of science as a professional discipline with clearly-defined problems and methods, and the influence of Kuhn’s Structure of Scientific Revolutions, which conceived scientific communities as epistemic isolates. This deflationary history of philosophy of science builds on recent scholarship in the area,1 ably motivating the arguments to follow. However, the institutional history of science advising does not add much to the argument, and could have been compressed. Douglas claims that the value-free ideal depends on the presupposition that science is isolated from society, and that this presupposition is belied by the increase in science advising in the twentieth century (65). However, the sense in which the role of science advisor connects science to society is prima facie compatible with philosophers’ abstracting from this connection (along with other aspects of scientific practice) in analyses of the distinctive epistemic features that ground the authority of science as a reliable guide for action. So Douglas’s historical argument against the value-free ideal is somewhat overstated.

There is more to the negative argument, however. In Chapter 4, Douglas builds on Rudner’s 1953 thesis that “the scientist qua scientist makes value judgments” because judgment that a given amount of evidence is sufficient to accept a hypothesis depends in part on assessment of the risks involved in error.2 Assessment of these risks involves considering the seriousness of consequences of mistakes, and such deliberations depend on ethical or social values. In excluding these values from evidential assessment, the value-free ideal stymies the core activity of science. Douglas gives the old argument a new twist by treating acceptance of the value-free ideal itself as a moral question: should scientists attempt to follow the value-free ideal? The answer is no: the value-free ideal conflicts with our general responsibility to consider the consequences of error in deciding what to do, and there is no good reason to exempt scientists from this general responsibility. The value-free ideal therefore must be rejected on moral grounds. Douglas’s claims about moral responsibility are plausible, though the supporting arguments would need further development to satisfy experts in ethics and value theory. However, the book is not intended as a contribution to ethics. The main achievement of this chapter, and indeed of the book as a whole, is to reconceive the scientist as an active agent with an authoritative voice in our society, rather than an idealized epistemic agent assessing evidential support for hypotheses (70-73). The moral argument against the value-free ideal is thus relevant and, though not decisive, merits serious consideration.

In Chapter 5, the heart of the book, Douglas argues that science can be value-laden, yet retain its integrity as a source of reliable knowledge. On this account, the research process is conceived as a sequence of decision-points, from problem-selection to hypothesis-choice, at which values play direct or indirect roles. Within this framework, the conflict of ideals is clearly articulated. Proponents of the value-free ideal classify values as epistemic vs. non-epistemic or cognitive vs. non-cognitive, and argue that values of the ‘non’ category (including ethical and social values) should be excluded from hypothesis-choice. Douglas proposes that, rather than limit the kinds of value that can legitimately play any role at different stages of research, we should limit the kinds of role that any value can legitimately play at different stages of research. In their direct role, values provide reasons for a decision. In their indirect role, values help manage uncertainties pertaining to evidence (103-108). The value-laden ideal gives diverse values a necessary and legitimate role throughout the research process, which is direct at early stages and indirect at later ones (e.g., hypothesis-choice). Science is unacceptably “politicized” when values usurp the direct role of evidence in hypothesis-choice (112-113).

Douglas’s account of the “structure of values in science” is an important contribution to the debate over science and values, offering a bracing challenge to Lacey’s recent defense of the value-free ideal.3 The general framework is articulated in detail, and its cogency illustrated with numerous examples, including a vivid case study of policy pertaining to the estrogen imitator DES (108-112). Within this framework, Douglas argues persuasively that the value-free ideal is both too strict, excluding social and ethical values needed to manage uncertainty and weigh the importance of error, and too lax, allowing cognitive values such as simplicity and explanatory power to direct theory-choice. Those who already accept a legitimate role for values throughout the research process will appreciate Douglas’s reworking of familiar underdetermination arguments so as to display their relevance for policymaking.

The account of values in science raises many questions. One might ask, for example, how far Douglas has really moved from the value-free ideal. Her account distinguishes epistemic from cognitive values, thereby preserving an epistemic core of science (93-95). Cognitive values such as simplicity, explanatory power, scope, and fruitfulness are interpreted as heuristics for detecting error, rather than indicators of truth or reliability (112). Douglas puts these on par with social and ethical values; all stem from goals or domains of concern relevant to science (92). However, true/reliable knowledge of the world is set apart as the source of science’s value to our society, and values necessary for this goal (internal coherence and empirical adequacy) are set apart from other values, serving as minimal criteria that any scientific hypothesis must satisfy (94-96). But why restrict epistemic values to necessary criteria, rather than include those that help us achieve reliable knowledge, as simplicity and explanatory power arguably do? The distinction between epistemic and other values seems ad hoc. Furthermore, since improved evidence reduces uncertainty, and hence the importance of values in hypothesis-choice, Douglas’s arguments seem to equally well support the ideal of minimizing the role of non-epistemic values at the core of science (103). The latter preserves the spirit of the value-free ideal, if not its letter.

These concerns do not obviate the merits of Douglas’s positive account, which continues with a defense of scientific objectivity (Chapter 6). Inclusion of social and ethical values in evidential assessment of hypotheses seems to undercut the objectivity of scientific claims. Douglas addresses this concern by distinguishing eight senses of objectivity (united by a sense of “strong trust and persuasive endorsement”) attributed to claims based on features of the processes that produce those claims (116). Articulating the bases of trustworthiness for human interactions with the world, individual cognition, and social processes makes explicit the grounds of science’s reliability and authority. Of the eight senses of objectivity so distinguished (manipulable, convergent, detached, value-free, value-neutral, procedural, concordant and interactive), only the value-free sense is incompatible with the value-laden account of the previous chapter (122-123).

Douglas’s survey of senses of objectivity in relation to scientific processes is excellent, though much of this material is familiar.4 Concerns that the value-free ideal is incompatible with scientific objectivity tout court are decisively put to rest. The discussion of objectivity, though valuable in its own right, would have better served the book’s argument if its framework of scientific processes and bases of trustworthiness had been integrated with the structure of values in the previous chapter. Chapter 6 surveys three kinds of scientific process, distinguishing multiple senses of objectivity associated with each. But only one of these processes, individual scientific reasoning, is directly connected to the arguments of the previous chapter; the associated senses of objectivity being detached, value-free and value-neutral. So this process would seem to merit additional scrutiny; the concept of reliability would have benefited from further clarification as well. Instead of complementing Chapter 5 by explicating the bases of objectivity most relevant to the value-laden ideal, Chapter 6 adds to the complexity of Douglas’s account by multiplying distinctions and categories – a liability given the book’s intended audience and relevance for policy.

The final chapters examine the implications of the value-laden ideal for science in policymaking, focusing on scientific integrity and democratic accountability. Chapter 7 returns to the role of the science advisor, tracing controversies in the 1970s and 1980s over how to define this role so as to safeguard scientific integrity. A related theme is the problem of dueling experts: how to distinguish “sound” from “junk” science, and determine which scientific claims are sufficiently reliable for policy decisions? Focusing on assessment of risks to humans posed by chemicals in the environment, Douglas argues that, since case-specific judgments about evidential assessment cannot be fully replaced by general inference guidelines, social and ethical values are needed in their indirect role. The value-laden ideal facilitates making this role explicit, increasing the transparency and democratic accountability of science in policy. At the same time, the integrity of science is preserved, since a direct role for values in the assessment of claims about risk, or absence of other bases of objectivity, is a hallmark of “junk science”. Though the value-laden ideal is no recipe for distinguishing “sound science” from “junk”, it does offer a framework for discussion of values in science that moves beyond rhetorical epithets, and can defuse debate where experts legitimately disagree (149-150).

Finally, Douglas discusses various mechanisms for increasing public participation in the science and policy process, showing how the value-laden ideal supports and clarifies recent proposals by policymakers (Chapter 8). As in the rest of the book, the argument is developed with vivid and timely examples, such as management of oil spill risk in Valdez, Alaska, and consensus conferences on telecommunications in the US and Europe (164-168). This examination of ways to expand democratic accountability by public involvement, though speculative, demonstrates the relevance of philosophical thinking about science and values for current debates about policymaking, highlighting areas for further work and potentially fruitful ties with philosophy of the social sciences.

Does Science, Policy, and the Value-Free Ideal show that we should reject the value-free ideal for science? The book’s multiple strands of argument, from history, ethics, philosophy of science and values, and recent episodes of policymaking, together make a compelling case that we need not accept it, articulating a framework for studying science in which the value-free ideal is unmotivated, immoral, and theoretically and practically problematic. Moreover, Douglas persuasively argues that the value-laden framework is appropriate for an important class of cases, such as environmental risk assessment, in which striving for the value-free ideal has led to confusion and obfuscation. It is less clear that the ideal of value-laden science should replace the value-free ideal in general. Though Douglas’s account performs admirably in the cases considered, it does not obviously generalize to all of science. Given the great diversity of scientific practices and myriad relations of science and society, why assume that the normative status of the direct/indirect role distinction is uniform for all of (natural) science? One might grant the parity of ethical, social and cognitive values for certain cases, such as environmental risk assessment and medical research, without accepting the value-laden ideal (or any single ideal) for all of science. Douglas does not engage pluralism or disunity of science, treating science throughout as a monolithic activity defined by inductive method: “to generate hypotheses about the world and to gather evidence from the world to test those hypotheses” (1). Yet her own careful examinations of policy episodes highlight the importance of case-specific considerations, and the book’s exclusive focus on US policymaking surely renders its conclusions local in some sense.

One need not accept Douglas’s strong general conclusion to appreciate the merits of the book. Science, Policy, and the Value-Free Ideal is an important contribution to the debate over science and values, and its account of value-laden science will be of interest to philosophers concerned with policy, scientific objectivity, and the social relevance of philosophy of science. Those who consider the value-free ideal moribund will yet find Douglas’s emphasis on science as a source of trustworthy advice within a complex landscape of diverse values challenging and provocative. The ideal of value-laden science, like Douglas’s view of science itself, is intended for practical use, and the book a welcome invitation for philosophers of science to engage more fully with policy issues, a too-often neglected aspect of scientific practice.

1 E.g., Reisch, G. (2005) How the Cold War Transformed Philosophy of Science. Cambridge: Cambridge UP.

2 Rudner, R. (1953) “The scientist qua scientist makes value judgments”. Philosophy of Science 20: 1-6.

3 Lacey, H. (2005) Values and Objectivity in Science: the Current Controversy about Transgenic Crops. London: Routledge.

4 Douglas, H. (2004) “The irreducible complexity of objectivity”. Synthese 138: 453-473.