Scientific Representation: Paradoxes of Perspective

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Bas C. van Fraassen, Scientific Representation: Paradoxes of Perspective, Oxford University Press, 2008, 408pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199278220.

Reviewed by Gabriele Contessa, Carleton University


Most philosophers of science today seem to agree on two points. The first is that scientific models play a central role in science (either because scientific theories are collections of models or because models mediate between theories and the world); the second is that scientific models, unlike sentences or propositions, are not truth-apt -- i.e. they are not capable of being true or false. But, how do models relate to the world, if not by being true or false? The most promising answer to this question seems to be that they do so pretty much like maps or portraits do -- i.e. by representing aspects or portions of it. Despite the increasing popularity of this picture of science based on models and representation, however, it is still not entirely clear how scientific models represent real-world systems and even less clear whether and how the many issues in philosophy of science that were traditionally discussed in terms of theories and truth are to be reformulated once one adopts this new picture.

Bas van Fraassen's new book, Scientific Representation: Paradoxes of Perspectives (SR), addresses these and many other related questions. In particular, SR attempts to finally resolve a slight tension between two important strands of van Fraassen's thought that have been present since before the publication of his groundbreaking The Scientific Image in 1980. On the one hand, as one of the early supporters of the semantic view of theories, van Fraassen has played a key role in establishing the new picture of science in which models and representation rather than theories and truth take center stage. On the other hand, as the proponent of constructive empiricism, the most significant brand of scientific anti-realism today, van Fraassen has long been involved in a debate which has mostly been conducted in terms of theories and truth. So, for example, one of the central theses of constructive empiricism as originally formulated by van Fraassen himself is that acceptance of a scientific theory only involves belief that the theory is empirically adequate (i.e. true about what is observable by us) as opposed to true. But, if, as the semantic view suggests, theories are collections of models and models are not truth-apt, how can theories be true or empirically adequate?

At first sight, this could appear to be a relatively small problem, which can be dealt with simply by carefully translating the main theses of constructive empiricism in terms of models and representation rather than theories and empirical adequacy, but this is not the case. Van Fraassen, who has never been oblivious to the apparent tension in his views, has tried on numerous occasions to put possible worries about it to rest by sketching something along the lines of what he now calls empiricist structuralism, but it is only in SR that he fully develops and defends this view. What many might find surprising is that what might have appeared to be a small problem to be solved by a trivial translation exercise has actually led van Fraassen to what would seem to be a change of heart on some crucial issues.

The overall picture depicted by van Fraassen in SR is somewhat familiar to those who are acquainted with the "layer-cake" picture favored by van Fraassen and other supporters of the semantic view. According to this picture, the representation relation is a relation that does not hold directly between models and the world but between two various kinds of models -- including theoretical models and data models, which form, respectively, the top and the bottom "layers" of the cake. According to van Fraassen's empiricist structuralism, the representational relation in question is a relation of embedding. "Science represents the empirical phenomena as embeddable in certain abstract structures (theoretical models), [which] are describable only up to structural isomorphism" (p. 238). According to van Fraassen, by adopting this picture, one can avoid what he considers one of the most serious challenges to the structuralist program -- i.e. "How can an abstract entity, such as a mathematical structure, represent something that is not abstract, something in nature?" (p. 240). Thus, van Fraassen's move is to claim that the abstract mathematical structures used by scientists to represent the world never come into direct representational contact with the world itself but only with other abstract mathematical structures. But how can any of these structures represent the world (or even just the phenomena) if none of them ever comes into direct representational contact with it? Van Fraassen's answer, as far as I understand it, is that the structures that form the "bottom layer", the data models, are connected to reality because they are constructed by piecing together what van Fraassen now calls the "appearances" -- i.e. the contents of the measurement outcomes -- which are themselves representations of reality, and which need not even supervene on reality. What the phenomenon is like taken by itself "does not determine which structures are data models for it -- that depends on our selective attention to the phenomenon, and our decisions in attending to certain aspects, to represent them in certain ways and to a certain extent" (p. 254).

The radical implications of this view become completely apparent a few pages later in van Fraassen's revealing discussion of a simple fictional example. In the example (which I modify slightly here), at a town hall meeting, someone (call him Professor Deerstalker) is presenting his theory about which factors affect the growth of the deer population in Red Deer, Alberta. In the process, Professor Deerstalker displays a graph of the growth of the deer population in the area over a certain period of time. At the end of the presentation, a member of the audience, call her Ms Nitpicker, concedes that Deerstalker's theory "fits" the graph well but asks whether his theory "fits" equally well the actual growth of the deer population. Professor Deerstalker proceeds to explain how he arrived at the graph by measuring diligently and responsibly the values of various parameters over time, but Ms Nitpicker is not satisfied by his answer, because her worry is not so much about the procedure that led to the construction of the graph as it is about whether or not the graph accurately represents the growth of the deer population in the area over time (as van Fraassen puts it, the point she is making is about metaphysics not epistemology). Now, according to van Fraassen

Although [Professor Deerstalker] can see the logical leeway on which [Ms Nitpicker] trades there is no leeway for [him] in this context, short of withdrawing [his] graph altogether. Since this is [his] representation of the deer population growth, there is for [him] no difference between the question whether [the theory] fits the graph and the question whether [it] fits the deer population growth (p. 256, emphasis in the original).

Van Fraassen then goes on to suggest that "if [Professor Deerstalker] were to opt for a denial or even a doubt, [his response] would be as paradoxical as any of Moore's Paradox forms, like 'It isn't so, but I believe it is'" (p. 256) and that "In fact, [he] would become incoherent if [he] lets [such a] challenge to lead [him] into any such concession" (p. 256).

For all van Fraassen says, however, I see no good reasons to think that Professor Deerstalker has no options other than either standing by the accuracy of his graph or withdrawing it, nor do I see any good reasons to think that even doubting the accuracy of the graph would put Professor Deerstalker in a paradoxical situation or make his position incoherent as van Fraassen claims. After all, the very fact that Professor Deerstalker is attempting to represent the growth of the deer population in a certain well-defined area seems to presuppose that there is a fact of the matter as to how many deer live in that area at each time independently of his attempts at estimating that. Moreover, as Professor Deerstalker would presumably concede, not all methods for measuring the size of the deer population seem to be equally reliable and this seems to presuppose that some methods for estimating the size of the deer population at a certain time, when applied correctly, are more likely than others to give as a result a number that is close to the actual number of deer in the area at that time. Furthermore, since, if there are any completely reliable methods for estimating the size of the deer population, they are presumably very resource-intensive, Professor Deerstalker will probably have to concede that the methods he has employed in the gathering of the data fall short of being completely reliable. But, if Professor Deerstalker concedes all of the above (and van Fraassen has given us no good reason to suggest he does not or should not), then Professor Deerstalker must also concede that there is a fact of the matter as to how accurately his graph represents the growth of the deer population.

Of course, Professor Deerstalker might stand by the accuracy of his graph and claim that the graph represents the population accurately or, at least, accurately enough for the purpose at hand. However, I do not see any good reason to think that it would be incoherent or paradoxical for Professor Deerstalker to not concede that the graph does not represent the growth of the deer population as accurately as it should and maybe even mention which aspects of the growth of the deer population he has reasons to think the graph does not represent accurately enough. Nor do I see any reasons to think that it would be incoherent for him to admit that he believes the graph to be a very crude representation of the growth of the population, but, since it is still the best representation of the growth of the deer population available, we have no choice but to make do with it until we have a more accurate representation. Whatever his answer might be, however, once Professor Deerstalker concedes that there is a fact of the matter as to how accurately the graph represents the deer population growth, he also thereby concedes that there is in principle a difference between asking how well the theory fits the data and how well it fits the world even if in practice it might be the case that he has no other reasons to answer the second question than the reasons that underlie his answer to the first question plus the reasons that make him believe that the data model represents the growth of the population accurately.

Much of the appeal of van Fraassen's constructive empiricism, I suspect, was due to its being closer to the centre of the realist/antirealist spectrum than most varieties of scientific antirealism that were common at the time. In particular, I think, many found van Fraassen's significant concessions to scientific realism, and in particular van Fraassen's insistence on construing theories literally and taking them to be truth-evaluable, made constructive empiricism a much more plausible and less extreme form of scientific antirealism. Many passages of SR, however, cannot but leave the reader with the impression that van Fraassen's views have shifted towards a more radical form of antirealism. According to this form of antirealism, we do not seem to have any direct epistemic access to the world -- not even the observable portion of it, which, according to constructive empiricism, seemed to be within our direct epistemic reach. All we seem to have direct epistemic access to are our representations of the world (which include the appearances) but there is no representation-independent reality with which these representations can be confronted. If the form of antirealism that van Fraassen develops and defends in SR is radical, it is, however, in no way crude. To the contrary, empiricist structuralism seems to be even more sophisticated than constructive empiricism, which often seemed to be caught in a epistemological limbo between agnosticism about the unobservable and an almost naïve realism about the observable. As such, empiricist structuralism is likely to prove an even more formidable opponent for scientific realists of all stripes and to be at the center of the debate for a long time to come.