Searle and Foucault on Truth

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C. G. Prado, Searle and Foucault on Truth, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 196pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521671337.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


C.G. Prado's work has been dedicated to the narrowing of the divide between Anglo-American and Continental philosophy. His first book, Starting with Foucault: An Introduction to Genealogy (2005) is an analytically oriented overview of Michel Foucault's work, showing how it engages problems thought to be the sole province of Anglo-American philosophy. The current work delves into a particular problem, that of truth, and again seeks to show how Foucault's work answers to issues that would normally be seen from an Anglo-American perspective. In this case, Prado contrasts what he calls Foucault's discursive-currency view of truth from John Searle's relational conception of truth. He argues that although Foucault and Searle have diverging views of truth, they share a commitment to realism, that is, the view that there is a reality out there that affects our experience. The question is whether that reality is relevant to our conception of truth.

Prado recognizes that readers of Searle are unlikely to be very familiar with Foucault's work and vice versa, and so starts his book with two admittedly quick overviews of each thinker. In his treatment of Searle, he emphasizes that Searle rejects the label of correspondence theorist of truth, saying that one cannot hold one's words in one hand and the world in the other in order to compare them. Nevertheless, Searle holds that it is the world that makes our claims about it true or false. For instance, if one has the belief that one's keys are on the table, it is the fact that said keys are on said table that makes that belief true. What Searle seems to be seeking is a way to make the correspondence theory -- which compares words and things -- and the disquotational theory -- which is solely intralinguistic -- converge. However, this convergence requires the world to play its role in confirming or disconfirming our claims about it.

Prado's discussion of Searle is fairly critical. In particular, he takes up Searle's discussion of the background capacities and social conventions necessary to have certain beliefs, arguing that these are hard to square with Searle's relational conception of truth, since what they are about is not something out there in the world that could confirm or disconfirm beliefs about them.

In turning to Foucault's discussions of truth, Prado notes that there is no single thread that ties those discussions together. Instead, Foucault appeals to five different uses of truth. The constructivist use holds that truth is a product of power relationships. The criterial use is that truth is relative to particular discourses. The perspectivist use is that there is no grand, overarching story that can be told to tie together particular viewpoints; instead, "there are only interpretations." (p. 88) The experiential use of truth is opposed to the constructivist view. It holds that truth can be a matter of the experiences one has, particularly those experiences that contradict or subvert the truths produced by the power relationships in a given social arrangement. Finally, and seemingly in tension with at least the constructivist and criterial uses of truth, the tacit-realist use of truth is committed to the idea that there is a reality that has something to do with what we believe.

Prado argues that the dispersion of these uses of truth do not, by themselves, present a problem for Foucault. He offers the analogy with the idea of the good, arguing that goodness can be predicated of disparate things without thereby losing its character as good. What Foucault must face, however, are two problems. First, there is the internal problem of how to reconcile his tacit-realist use of truth with his constructivist and criterial uses. Second, inasmuch as he privileges the latter, one wonders how he can account for what seem like simple cases of truth, like the belief that one's keys are on the table.

The issue between Searle's and Foucault's view of truth, Prado argues, centers on confirmation. Searle believes that it is the world that confirms or disconfirms our beliefs -- that the world makes true or false. The belief that one's keys are on the table is confirmed or disconfirmed by the whereabouts of the keys. Foucault believes that confirmation and disconfirmation are discursive, that only a belief can justify another belief. In this way, Foucault finds himself closer to the views of Donald Davidson and Richard Rorty. Prado argues forcefully that Searle's view remains beset by the problems traditionally attaching to the correspondence theory of truth, but uses most of his energy to discuss Foucault's view. In particular, if Foucault holds a discursive view of truth, this raises the question of the status of his own genealogies. Are we to take them as true, in which case are they exempt from the constructivism he accords to other discourses? Or are they merely fictions, in which case why should we believe them?

Here Prado argues, weakly in my view, that Foucault's genealogies stand as challenges to dominant views of what is true and false, rather than as true in their own right. "All that need be entailed," he claims, "is that what has been internalized as truth, and become current and dominant in discourse, is or has become oppressive and supports power relations that stifle new thought." (p. 107). This claim, even if correct, would commit Foucault to the truth or falsity of whether power relations are indeed stifling. There must be a fact of the matter about that. And part of the burden of his genealogies is precisely to show the stifling character of the evolution of particular practices. As I will argue momentarily, the problem in Prado's analysis, here and elsewhere, lies in his confusing issues of truth with those of justification.

In the final chapter of the book, Prado argues that the epistemic divide between Searle and Foucault must be conceived in a particular way. Although it is often thought that Searle's relational conception of truth is predicated on a realism about the world, while Foucault's discursive conception is predicated on a denial of the world or an irrealism, only the first view is correct. Searle does indeed found his view of truth on a realism that confirms or disconfirms our beliefs. Foucault, however, is no irrealist. Prado relies here on Rorty to give a more plausible interpretation of Foucault. Rather than denying realism, Foucault denies that reality plays an epistemic role, in particular that it justifies our beliefs. There is, as Rorty would have it, a brute reality. That reality, while crucial to our experience, is irrelevant to the justification of truth, which can only occur discursively. So, while Searle and Foucault diverge in their conception of truth, they are both realists. What divides them is that for Searle realism is tied to truth, while for Foucault they are distinct issues.

Prado's project here strikes me as less successful than his last endeavor articulating Foucault in terms of Anglo-American philosophy. While I need to trust his specific take on Searle, which jibes with what I know of Searle's philosophy, and while I concur with his view of Foucault as a realist in Rorty's non-epistemic sense of realism, I think the discussion of Foucault on truth is lacking. This is because, as indicated before, Prado seems to confuse the issues of truth and justification. This confusion is no small matter for the book, since the key to Prado's epistemic view is that what divides Searle and Foucault is their view of truth's confirmation, i.e. what justifies truth claims. The problem, I believe, attaches to Prado's initial take on Foucault's view of truth.

Prado is certainly right to isolate different uses of truth in Foucault's work. This leads him to the tensions he cites in the book. He also notes that Foucault is largely unconcerned with developing an articulated view of truth. The lesson of this, it seems to me, is not that Foucault is using the idea of truth is several different ways. Rather, it is that he is lumping together more than one idea in his invocation of the term truth. Instead of reading Foucault as offering us different uses of truth, we are better served to read him as offering us several distinct ideas, all referred to by the idea of truth. In particular, when he speaks of truth, he is more often offering us a view of justification.

Seeing things this way immediately resolves in a simple fashion several problems Prado raises for Foucault. In particular, it resolves the two problems he isolates for Foucault's view of truth: the tension among the different uses of the concept and its counterintuitive character. The latter is resolved because justification, unlike truth, is more easily justified as purely discursive. As Prado himself notes, beliefs can be justified only by other beliefs, and not by a brute reality. This point is insisted upon in Anglo-American philosophy by the inferentialists such as Wilfrid Sellars and Robert Brandom, whose views Prado does not treat but who have much to offer his discussion. The former problem is resolved if we take justification as something that arises in practices, a point Foucault himself insisted upon. Inasmuch as justification is a matter of practices, and inasmuch as practices are inseparable from relations of power, then justification responds both to the constructivist and criterial uses of truth Prado cites. Further (although this point cannot be developed here), if we take Foucault's tacit-realist use of truth indeed to concern truth, but in a deflationary way, then Foucault can retain a concept of truth, distinguish it from justification, and not have to face the problems with which Prado confronts Searle. Finally, this approach allows Foucault to say that his genealogies can be justified even if they are inseparable from power. What genealogies do is raise questions about certain practices (e.g., psychology) on the basis of others (e.g., a particular history), a view that can be founded on Sellars' holistic view that any claim can be questioned, but only by holding other claims constant. This avoids Prado's having to say that the virtue of Foucault's genealogies lies primarily in their novelty and their challenge to dominant discourses rather than in their being discourses we actually have reason to believe.

The apparent motivation for Prado's wanting to avoid such a path is that he is at pains to distinguish truth from passing-for-true. The latter seems to bring in the worry that truth is just a game that cannot be taken seriously, a view that plays into the hands of the irrealist from which Prado wants to distance Foucault. However, if passing-for-true means justified rather than pretending-to-be-true, then passing-for-true is exactly Foucault's concern in his genealogies. In fact, it is Prado's concern as well, since, as noted, the issue that divides Prado and Foucault is confirmation, i.e. justification. Furthermore, such an approach retains Prado's overarching view that what divides Foucault and Searle is the epistemic view that realism plays in their thought.

In short, Prado saddles Foucault with a view that creates problems he then must solve for Foucault, when a simpler and more sympathetic reading would not create those problems in the first place. Moreover, it would avoid Prado's unsatisfying conclusion to the book:

What seems to emerge, then, is that the truth about truth must lie somewhere between the extremes marked by Searle's and Foucault's positions. Most simply put, it seems that some true beliefs and sentences are true in virtue of the disposition of the world, and some true sentences are true in virtue of their status in a discourse. (p. 172)

Rather than this conclusion, which leaves unanswered the most important questions Prado raises, why not say that beliefs and sentences are justified discursively, that truth is a deflationary matter, and that realism is epistemically inert? That is, why not offer a coherent defense of Foucault against Searle's relational view of truth, which Prado clearly does not accept? In this case, in contrast to Prado's earlier book, he is led astray by focusing on the wrong Anglo-American theorists. The inferentialism of Sellars and Brandom rather than the truth-conditional semantics of Davidson are where Foucault's views of truth and justification are properly aligned. The failure to see this alignment leads to the creation of problems that need not arise for Foucault's philosophy.