Selected Writings: On Self-organization, Philosophy, Bioethics, and Judaism

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Henri Atlan, Selected Writings: On Self-organization, Philosophy, Bioethics, and Judaism, Stefanos Geroulanos and Todd Meyers (eds.), Fordham University Press, 2011, 462pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823231829.

Reviewed by Alfred I. Tauber, Boston University and Tel Aviv University


English-speakers are being treated to a burst of translations of the works of Henri Atlan. Complementing this anthology of his writings, The Sparks of Randomness (Stanford 2011) has also recently appeared, and each work exudes the product of an extraordinarily eclectic mind grounded in the sciences, but whose scope extends well beyond to ethics and metaphysics. Atlan, a distinguished French and Israeli academician, is not easily characterized. Indeed, given the span of his expertise -- biomedicine, theoretical biology, bioethics, Spinoza, Jewish mysticism -- he holds a unique place in the firmament of contemporary philosophy. The very subtitle of this book of selected writings suggests a kaleidoscope of subjects that possesses no obvious unifying theme or trajectory of thought. One might pick up this book and think, correctly, that the author is a French physician-scientist, whose interest in Spinoza and Jewish thought has produced a strange omelet of topics. However, a hasty dismissal would deprive one of a fascinating tour of ideas leading to a mature philosophy. So while many might put the book down as either too scrambled or the subjects too technical, in fact, Atlan, throughout these essays, writes clearly and develops complicated concepts with a sympathetic eye to the non-specialist. The translations are excellent and the editors have provided a useful introductory overview. Once the mix of ideas is seen as a whole, the reader will perceive a philosophical medley worthy of serious consideration.

The anthology begins with Atlan's key essays on self-organization, which were early contributions to what would eventually become systems biology. These essays, which range over discussions of random Boolean networks, to mathematical treatment of redundancy, to historically-informed philosophical reviews of earlier theories, testify to the breadth of Atlan's scientific and philosophical sophistication. But beyond intellectual virtuosity, from this conceptual foundation Atlan's understanding of self-organization as a primary organizational principle reaches deeply not only into theoretical biology, but extends to all those human sciences that base themselves on formulations of human nature. In this regard, Atlan is one of the few philosophers today who is capable of basing a broad system of thought in a comprehensive understanding of the natural sciences, which is fully developed in a distinctive philosophy of biology.

Resisting the growing tides of reductionism that were ushered in with the rise of molecular biology in the 1980s and 1990s, Atlan championed a rival epigenetics (post-genetic processes) as critical to understanding the dynamics of development, physiology, and evolution. Mechanistic explanatory models of the dynamic, emergent properties characteristic of bio-systems demand a holistic approach, albeit coupled to elemental analysis (reductionism). To effectively capture those dynamics a physicist's appreciation of complexity theory is required, which Atlan coupled to a general intuition that macro- and microbiological processes require dynamic explanations of the plasticity, emergent phenomena, and non-linear, complex causation pathways characteristic of organic phenomena. The ready parallels drawn between the genetic code and the cybernetic analogy with computer programs, where the merger of 'information' and 'program' worked to again introduce the "argument by design" or the inscription of a homunculus into the gene, would not seduce him. As he observed, the function and goals of computers are externally prescribed, whereas organisms generate their own behavior, what he calls, the "self-creation of meaning."

So, instead of models built from classical simple mechanical or cybernetic systems, Atlan sees dynamic complexity at the heart of biological processes, and in his work on information theory, where others saw "noise" and error, he perceived the necessary resources for an organized physical system to develop increased complexity and thereby enhance opportunities for adaptive responses. So, 'noise' in one context becomes 'information' in another to provide new perceptions for organisms to use as they adapt to their environment. And from elements in associative exchange, self-organizational principles take hold to 'structure' the complexity.

This theory alone has had wide influence within philosophy of biology, but Atlan has extended the general tenor of his orientation to a wider array of biomedical issues. Primary among these are his cogent insights about our deep-set attitudes concerning life and its creation when confronted by the ethical challenges of various biotechnologies in reproductive medicine. Much of the recent French public interest in Atlan's writings may be attributed to his discussion of these issues, but here I am less interested in this aspect of his opus than with his larger philosophical ambitions, which this collection has been designed to capture.

To appreciate Atlan's work, one must recognize that his project seeks to draw the full philosophical significance of his ideas about self-organization in the particular context of the relationship between the mind and brain states, and from there he draws wide-ranging conclusions about personal identity and moral agency. For Atlan, mind and brain are, as for Spinoza, distinctive aspects of the same 'thing,' so consciousness must arise as a product of self-organizational neural networks as described in terms of unconscious and conscious mind. In his formulation, Atlan posits consciousness as the emergent property resulting from the memory of past neural sequences. The model begins with a series of states of a network that produce some effect, possibly by chance, which is then stored in memory. (This crucial element of chance, or error, is derived from Atlan's basic conception of a biological system self-organizing along both established and novel pathways, where noise and mistakes offer new opportunities for growth and development.) Then through association and memory the sequence is repeated, so that the last state, or a neighboring associated state, triggers the repetition of the sequence that produced it. Inspired by the Wittgenstein-Anscombe criticism of mentalist models of intentional actions, Atlan's model of goal-oriented behavior in a self-organizing network builds from Benjamin Libet's observations that deliberative actions actually occur before conscious awareness. Thus consciousness is a post facto event of observation or awareness of events already initiated and taking place. Accordingly, by self-organizational precepts, consciousness functions as a memory of constructing procedures, which transform "indetermination and randomness into structure and meaning by the dynamics of self-organized memory" (p. 327; emphasis in original).

Consciousness thus becomes part of ordering and signification to further an "intentional self-organizational" process, which strengthens and amplifies the original neuronal sequence. The sequence is transformed into a goal-oriented procedure by an apparent inversion of time, in which the last state causes the repetition of the sequence that produced it. Consciousness experiences the heretofore-unconscious bodily process from an 'observational' perspective, one embedded in neuronal circuitry but exhibiting a different kind of presentation we experience as consciousness. In sum, the mental, more specifically, the conscious brain, is an emergent property associated with memory of global self-organized brain states emerging from the dynamics of neural networks.

For Atlan, free will (the instantiation of consciousness as perceived in the apparent determination of choice or initiating voluntary action) is "merely an illusion created by ignorance of the causes of the body's affections" (p. 315). Indeed, establishing 'cause' can never be fully determined in biological systems. Not so dissimilar from Freud's own confrontation with the "arrogance of consciousness," Atlan has concretized "the unconscious" by a neuronal circuitry independent of an illusionary free will and, concomitantly, autonomy has been displaced by neuronal causality achieved through self-organization. The idea of freedom thus becomes a version of Spinoza's dictum that human freedom resides in the knowledge and internalization of our determinations (again, much as Freud opined, from a very different locus of thought). The consequences for conceptions of personhood rippling forth from that construction have been well rehearsed.

Atlan builds this revision of humanism from his version of psycho-physicalist unity, which, like Spinozist monism, makes no choice between idealism and materialism and instead perceives mind and brain as two attributes of a single unity. The clearest exposition of this construction, and its implications, is found in the 1998 essay, "Immanent causality: A Spinozist viewpoint of evolution and the theory of action" (pp. 216-36). There, Atlan argues that Spinoza's notion of immanent causality -- causa sui, cause of itself -- much like self-organization accounts for evolution "can be seen as the unfolding of a dynamic system or a process of complexification and self-organization of matter, produced as a necessary outcome of the laws of physics and chemistry" (p. 217; emphasis added). Yet we consciously think, and thus mind must be accounted for and its relation to body defined.

Citing Spinoza, the 'mind' is not some separate ontological entity and, correspondingly, it cannot determine the body's actions. Atlan develops a schema in which state I is the cause of state II. And within state I, mental mode A and brain mode B are two aspects of this initial state, and mental mode C and brain mode D are the resulting effects of state I. In Spinozist terms, A and C are modes of the attribute of thought, and B and D are modes of the attribute of extension, and, further, the causal connection between A and C is the same as the causal connection between B and D, not as parallel processes, but as the same. Simply, the two attributes of thought and extension are only two different expressions of the same substance, i.e., A and B are (as are C and D) one and the same. So, given the equivalence, how can Spinoza claim that A (mind) does not cause D (body) or B (body) does not cause C (mind)? Rejecting the two prominent resolutions of this dilemma, i.e., denying non-body mental states altogether or invoking parallelism to solve the apparent imbroglio, Donald Davidson instead argued that Spinoza must hold that a difference exists between a logical reason and a physical cause to explain the apparent confusion. The distinction is not ontological, but only reflects the inability to devise a language that allows us to describe mental events in physical terms, and vice versa. Atlan demurs.

Atlan builds his case by adopting Hilary Putnam's concept of "the synthetic identity of properties" (Reason, Truth, and History, Cambridge, 1981), which is distinguished from "analytical identity." For example, the physical magnitude "temperature" is identical to the "mean molecular kinetic energy" as defined by the kinetic theory of gases. However, this identity is not analytic, because the two sentences are not synonymous but are two different ways of expressing the same property. Analogously, Atlan asserts that such a synthetic identity may be applied to 'mind' and 'brain:' "a mental state is not the cause or effect of a given brain state, since it is this brain state, even though we cannot describe the mental state and the brain state by synonymous expressions" (p. 223). And to understand the causal relationship of mind and brain, Atlan draws the consequences of Spinoza's unique association of ontological monism and epistemic dualism, and accordingly revises Davidson's formulation of "anomalous monism" for a radical monolithic unity along Spinozist lines.

"What is at stake here is not the nature of the causal explanation, which, when adequate cannot be distinguished from the causal relation. What is at stake, rather, is the nature of the identity between C and D" (p. 230), which are united in the effected state II, as are A and B in I. A causes C or D, indifferently (and B causes C or D, indifferently) because C and D are one and the same, and then it is the collective state I (comprising A and B) that causes state II (comprising the two modes, C and D). The relation between A and C and that between B and D are both different ways of describing the relation of state I and state II. The particular descriptions cannot displace one another.

Atlan illustrates his argument by using the synthetic identity of 'temperature' and 'mean molecular kinetic energy' on the one hand, and of 'pressure' and 'force of molecular collisions,' on the other hand. The effect of temperature on gas pressure as described in the macroscopic thermodynamic domain (as A causing C, above) is the same as the effect of molecular kinetic energy on the force of molecular collisions as described in the microscopic domain of molecular kinetics (as B causing D, above). Here, two distinct descriptions of the kinetic theory of gases have been substituted by formal analogy for mental and brain states, respectively, and in so doing Atlan has applied synthetic (but not analytical) identity to show the relationship of mental and brain causal states. Both descriptions capture the same reality, but with two different methods of understanding.

The difference from Davidson's position is that we introduce the dualism of descriptions, not within the causal relation -- which remains as one and which includes both the causal relation and the explanation, assumed to be adequate -- but within the identity of the event, where mental C and physical D, although identical, need different descriptions, which cannot replace one another when related to A and B, respectively. (p. 231)

Spinoza's radical reconfiguration, contemporized by Atlan in his self-organizational theory, not only has broad implications for philosophy of mind (most directly, characterizing consciousness), but the theory also has broad implications for the metaphysics of personal identity and ethics. The loss of simple causation, the displacement of linear logic, and the absence of organic telos by physicochemical and molecular biology has steadfastly placed 'life' into a non-purposive, materialist universe, and with that development, an entire edifice of philosophy must be re-designed. In "Internal purposes, vitalism, and complex systems," (1991, p. 177-191), Atlan explains how organic teleology became a relic of a discarded vitalism, which in turn disrupts the scientific universality of linear rationality that undergirds humanist ethics. Atlan's interpretation of contemporary biology's epistemology has driven Kantian morality into a corner of no escape, for in a probabilistic, deterministic universe, autonomy has been lost and free will has been banished. And then where does moral philosophy reside? Atlan is primarily concerned with the crisis ethics faces when confronted with the alternative configurations of "man the machine" and moral subjects considered in some supernatural formulation. He falls back on pragmatic ethics and instead of some essentialist conception of the human, he settles for the law, a cultural construct, which in its historical practice displaces any conceit of an ethical ontology based in revelation or deontological necessity.

Atlan arrives at this ethics by recognizing how different modes of knowledge must remain in dialogue just as they must remain distinct. The reality of the person is not grounded in facts -- biological or psychological -- but rather in a fuller reality of experience, relationships, history, and belief. This vision of the person, residing at these interfaces, exemplifies his style of philosophy, one that draws its strength from his ability to synthesize diverse discourses -- ranging from biology to interpretations of Biblical stories and Hebrew language. (Of note, The Sparks of Randomness freely interpolates biology and ancient Midrash around the themes considered here, but with a much fuller development of determinist trends in Jewish thought as a repository for understanding moral and legal responsibility in the absence of free will.)

In conclusion, at age 80, Atlan has remained loyal to his own agenda, eschewing the calls of French existentialists and the postmodernists who followed to connect his work to the philosophical tradition of Bachelard and Canguilhelm, which may be broadly characterized as an attempt to draw the fullest philosophical conclusions from the science of the day. Atlan has conceived his own project along these lines while carefully avoiding the seductions of over-extending conclusions from the laboratory to misguided extrapolations in different spheres of thought. He easily moves between the scientific and the technical, the philosophical and the poetic, and he does so ever aware that while these languages must co-exist, they may (but should not) be confounded, for "the perception of reality is always pregnant with the imaginary, but the latter never takes the former's place; where the rationalities of science and of myth can subsist side by side without being confused and can criticize each other" (p. 255). In Enlightenment to Enlightenment (SUNY 1993), Atlan offered an extended argument about the legitimacy of different forms of knowledge and illustrated how easily they were conflated and erroneously employed when misapplied from one domain to another:

an anthropology of knowledge remains possible; but instead of being an explanatory and unifying meta-theory, it becomes the locus of dia­logue between contradictory conceptual frameworks that determine dif­ferent modes of defining what makes a fact a fact, different theories and different criteria of relevance. Even though criteria of truth can function in each of these frameworks, no single criterion traverses all of them. In terms of our own discussion, even though each game has its rules, there is no unique rule for playing with the games. (Atlan 1993, p. 370)

Accordingly, reality becomes a refraction of different ways of seeing and being, of organizing randomness and creating different forms of order.

In sum, as if such a summation is fair to the diversity of his thought, Atlan has re-captured Spinoza's dialectic of Natura naturans and Natura naturata that recognizes, in principle, that a multiplicity of forms, descriptions, and explanations are required to capture reality. So, instead of a singular epistemological strategy or disciplinary knowledge base, Atlan celebrates how a collective of diverse perspectives offer insights not available from any one of the refractions alone. Putatively, in their syntheses, novelty should appear. Reading Atlan, this intuition is amply confirmed and richly rewarded.