Self: Ancient and Modern Insights about Individuality, Life, and Death

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Richard Sorabji, Self: Ancient and Modern Insights about Individuality, Life, and Death, The University of Chicago Press, 2006, 400pp., $30.00 (cloth), ISBN 0226768252.

Reviewed by Marco Zingano, University of São Paolo


In this new book, Richard Sorabji endeavors to offer the reader a broad survey of ancient and modern discussions on a central, and typically recurrent, not to say resilient, topic of philosophic study: the individual as a self. As in his earlier books, Sorabji employs an enchanting variety of sources, most notably among the Greeks, where he draws on not only well-known authors, such as Plato and Aristotle,but also on some, such as the ancient commentators, who are little known to non-specialists. In this book, the range of his analysis is particularly large, including not only Western but also Indian thought, ranging from ancient Buddhist writers such as Nâgasena and Vasubandhu to contemporary analytic philosophers such as Charles Taylor and Derek Parfit.  The vast survey includes the Greco-Roman tradition, Christian theology up to Aquinas, some aspects of the Islamic tradition, and modern philosophy as represented by Locke, Descartes and Kant. In some sense, this book displays the best of Sorabji's way of treating a philosophical theme: he draws from a broad diversity of historical periods and authors, all with astonishing scholarship and erudition, thereby giving the reader an illuminating and refreshing perspective on the much-debated topics of individuality and self-awareness.

Sorabji's main thesis is that we cannot get rid of the self as the owner of experiences and actions without losing our grasp on the world. There is a need to see the world in terms of me, so that the word I becomes vital for our survival. A person means someone who has psychological states and does things; a thinker means someone who has thoughts: "this having and doing can be summed up by saying that a person owns psychological states and actions" (p. 21). This is why we should speak of an owner of experiences and actions, referring, however, not to any entity distinct from the embodied being, but always to an embodied self. The modern denial of the self, which takes the person to be only a stream of consciousness, stems from the correct feeling that one has to abandon the Cartesian disembodied ego. However, as soon as one takes the self to be necessarily embodied, the modern denial becomes misguided. We need to view the world in terms of me because so much of life (particularly our moral agency, but also perception and much else) depends on this me.  This is no direct proof of the existence of the self, as the author himself recognizes, but it does shift the burden of proof: those who want to claim that the 'I'-perspective is only illusory now have the onus of disproving this need, and of explaining life in terms of a stream of consciousness or something similar. Sorabji insists that there must be not only a certain psychological connectedness and continuity, but also sameness of person, understood as ownership of psychological states. He argues convincingly for this view, pointing out that otherwise our own conditions of survival will inevitably disappear.  For example, compassion for the sufferings of other people requires a thicker notion of the individual than that based on a thin connectedness and continuity of consciousness.

This topic is not peculiar to modern thought; it can be found among the ancient Greeks, as well as in sophisticated Hindu discussions on reincarnation. The reason for its pervasive presence in philosophical debates is that the denial or defense of the self is directly connected to our fear of death, which is obviously as widespread as death itself, so that conceptions of the self govern and at the same time are governed by this fear. The last chapter of the book, titled "If We do not Survive Death, Is It Irrational to Feel Dismay?", tries to link all the other topics of the book to the ultimate issue of whether we survive death.  Sorabji believes "that circular time is in principle possible".  According to him,

there is no reason to assert, but also no way to deny, that our universe, despite its inclusion of at least one big bang, might involve a huge circle of time. As we would have no knowledge of this, we cannot enjoy, if this is what we want, more than the possibility that our dying breath will not be our last. (p. 326)

This will suffice for some people, but one can doubt whether it will be of any real significance for those on the point of dying.  It is like the highly rational but totally uncomforting remark by Hume on his death-bed to Boswell: that it is irrational to feel horror at the prospect of future non-existence, since we do not feel horror at our past non-existence before our birth (337).  Such a remark may, as Sorabji suggests, be "useful at the intellectual level" for some people, but it is ineffective in the face of the personal reality of death, a fact that we should take as showing that our fear of death is strong enough to invade the most rational argument about self and individuality and distort it to make room for some consolation.

Discussing the self requires discussing self-awareness, and here the problem of unity is central. We can see, from Sorabji's vantage point, the difficulties the ancients encountered because they were discussing the need for a single faculty instead of the need for a unitary person, the owner of these psychological states: "they did not consider the option I find more plausible, that what needs to be unitary is not the faculties, but the owner of the faculties" (p. 246). They asked the wrong question, for "if there is unity in one's self-awareness, the unity is supplied by the single owner of the awareness, not by the owner's using a single faculty" (p. 260).

Here Aristotle provides a very interesting example. In De anima, he seems to locate self-perception in each faculty of perception: we perceive by sight that we are seeing and so on. There are obvious objections to such a stance: if what we see are only colors and we see that we see, is the sight itself colored in order to be seen? Aristotle is well aware of these difficulties, and he gives another answer to the problem of self-perception: the common sense is responsible for it, as well as for apprehending the common sensibles (such as movement and number) and for attributing to the same thing its color and its smell, for instance. This is one possible answer; another is the Platonic one, which says that the soul's reasoning is the condition needed for being aware of one's own states. For Aristotle, there is a higher-order perception, for Plato, a higher-order thought. We find here the same alternatives as in contemporary discussions of self-awareness. Both solutions contain the threat of an infinite regress, which is dismissed by Sorabji as not being really a problem, because, although there is no level at which my latest act of awareness of awareness is in principle immune to inspection, I am freed from a dizzying regress by the all-too-human phenomenon of fatigue: "it is merely fatigue that makes me leave one such act uninspected. A divine mind, if infinite, might be able to inspect infinitely many, but we cannot" (p. 206).

Aristotle treats thinking itself differently, positing a direct self-awareness whereby thinking thinks itself. In self-thinking, there is no higher-order thought that assures self-awareness. Sorabji countenances other possibilities, for example, those that appeal to imagination. He highlights a solution reported by the author of the commentary on the De anima often ascribed to Philoponus. In this commentary one reads that newer interpreters say that it belongs to another faculty, the attentive part, to stand over acts of thought and of perception (253, citing to Philoponus in DA 3, 464,24 - 465,31). These newer interpreters, "starting perhaps with Proclus" (p. 249), postulated a new part of the soul, the prosektikon or the attentive part. This could be seen as just complicating the situation by adding a new faculty.  But the move becomes attractive in the light of Sorabji's claim that what matters is a unitary owner, not a unitary faculty. These newer interpreters give attending a central role in order to account for one's perceiving that one perceives, or one's thinking that one thinks, precisely as if they were attempting to shift the problem of awareness from the search for a unitary faculty to that of a unitary owner of faculties. This is one more instance of the transforming of Aristotle by the commentators, and, in this case, a very intelligent one, which deserves more scrutiny.

One of Sorabji's main arguments against taking the individual as a momentary bundle of properties is that our agency and motivation require continuing owners of psychological states. He claims that only a person in this sense can play the role of a benefactor or beneficiary, try to avert an accident, or be compassionate (p. 274). In short, ethics requires owners. Let me make two remarks on this point. The thesis that the individual is a unique bundle of characteristics clearly appears in Porphyry's Introduction (Isagôgê). Sorabji rightly insists that Porphyry is not drawing on Aristotle, but on Plato, for Plato speaks of an individual as consisting of uniquely distinctive characteristics (Theaetetus 209c; this idea is picked up later by the Middle Platonist Alcinous in his introduction to Platonism). However, Sorabji ascribes to Aristotle the thesis of individual forms, an ascription that, he says, "has been convincingly argued by others" (p. 137, referring to Albritton, Heinaman and A. C. Lloyd in a note). The ascription may be correct, but the issue is certainly controversial. That the individual has features the assemblage of which is not found elsewhere (Isagôgê 7, 22) was taken by subsequent commentators as representing the Aristotelian position, since they found it in Porphyry's introduction to many of Aristotle's ideas. But why, asks Sorabji, should Porphyry have offered the Theaetetus's view of individuals in an introduction to Aristotle? His answer: "I suspect because he is speaking to beginning students who are about to read Aristotle's Categories, which does not even mention matter and form, so Porphyry does not want to go into those complications" (p. 139/4); moreover, Alcinous' treatise, which is also an introduction (although to Plato), cites the same view, so there was a precedent. The needs of students, notably beginners, may be the cause of many errors, but it is worth noticing that Aristotle states this Platonic view in Metaphysics VII 15 1040a8-15 in connection with a criticism of Plato. Aristotle's reply is far from clear (as Jonathan Barnes remarked in his commentary on Porphyry's Introduction, Oxford 2003 p. 154), but this shows that the whole problem seems to be more complex, and not to be resolved simply by reference  to the kind of audience an author is addressing.

My second remark concerns the way Sorabji treats the notion of proairesis. This notion should have an important role, for it is central to the claim that we are agents, and agency, according to Sorabji, is incompatible with the idea of a man being simply a located stream of consciousness. Sorabji takes the notion to mean, for Aristotle, a long-term policy for life, the policy decision that is taken in advance of action (this is how he interprets the pro of proairesis). This is possible, although also controversial; probably the pro means taking one thing rather than another, or preferring A to B, and not temporal precedence. Aristotle says in Nicomachean Ethics III 3 1113a5-7 that we stop deliberating when we refer the source of action to the leading part (hêgoumenon) of ourselves. Sorabji comments: "here Aristotle's word already puts us in mind of the later Stoic term for what takes decisions, hêgemonikon, the command center" (p. 188). This is also possible; it is in fact the way Aspasius reads the passage. But if we compare this passage to the corresponding one of the Eudemian Ethics, it seems that the leading part may be just that part with which we begin an action, as one begins to walk with his left or right leg. This is the way the ethica vetus interpreted hêgoumenon (et in antecedentem id); Grosseteste translated it also by et ipsius in antecedens,  a translation Aquinas accepted. Sorabji wants to see in proairesis roughly the will, or at least the precursor of the idea of the will. He adopts will as a translation for proairesis in Epictetus, not without some hesitation, for he remarks that "there is no element of will power in the notion; it is more intellectual than that, being a kind of reason" (p. 194). The will surely requires a thicker notion of the self, for it supposes a power, the I, that decides independently of the reasons argued for or against a case. The problem is that such a power is clearly absent in Aristotle and in Epictetus. Acting against one's own best reasons is not seen as a manifestation of the power of will, but as a kind of failure to follow reason (the failure called akrasia).  A thinner notion of choosing by deliberation, without any appeal to such a power, is not incompatible with, and probably requires also a unitary owner of states, but it surely shows that the story of the self is still more complicated -- especially when it is connected with that of the will.

My final remark must be one of frank praise. This book offers the reader an invaluable guide to the depths of the notions of self, person, agency, individuality, life, death. It provides a highly stimulating view of how all these topics are connected in ancient and modern writings on questions central to our lives. I cannot but recommend a most careful reading of this book.