Self and Other: Exploring Subjectivity, Empathy, and Shame

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Dan Zahavi, Self and Other: Exploring Subjectivity, Empathy, and Shame, Oxford University Press, 2014, 280pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199590681.

Reviewed by Thomas Nenon, University of Memphis


This book continues Dan Zahavi's ongoing discussion of the closely related themes of subjectivity, selfhood, intersubjectivity, and sociality. Following several other books he has previously published on these topics, this one presents Zahavi's considered views on them primarily through a critical engagement with a whole range of contemporary philosophers' and empirical researchers' theories on selfhood, subjectivity, and the underpinnings of human social interaction, with special attention to the phenomena of empathy and shame. Generally speaking, the result is a validation of insights achieved in the phenomenological tradition by thinkers such as Max Scheler, Edmund Husserl, Edith Stein, Jean-Paul Sartre, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Alfred Schutz. In each case, though, Zahavi relies on his own phenomenological analyses that guide his readings of these thinkers' works as he translates their findings into his own independently developed terminology.

The book is divided into three main parts, each with several chapters that contrast his position with several specific researchers who hold competing theories. Part I is focused on defending a robust dimension of first-person experience that Zahavi calls experiential selfhood, a kind of prereflective awareness of experiences as in each case mine, that dimension of experience as the "what it is like for me" that precedes any reflective, objectifying form of explicit self-awareness. He argues that it is part of experience itself to involve not only the consciousness of the objective contents of various kinds of experiences (including, for instance, not just perception but also remembering or imagining something), but also a direct awareness of this content being there for me in a certain way. He shows how a proper understanding of the self can avoid many of the problems associated with some understandings of selfhood and subjectivity that lead to all kinds of different theories that deny the existence of anything like a self or that see it as a social construction or the product of certain practices like narratives. Zahavi does not deny that many of the claims traditionally associated with strong notions of subjectivity and self-consciousness are untenable. He argues simply that an accurate description of mental life should include a recognition of a dimension of selfhood that is an essential element of experience itself. Zahavi claims not only that this experiential selfhood is undeniable and elementary but also that it must be taken into account if theories about how we understand others are to avoid collapsing the selfhood of the other into a form of self-awareness as well.

One consistent theme throughout the book is the complexity of the various components that make up our full and concrete understandings of ourselves. So while Zahavi identifies the experiential self as one essential element of selfhood, he at the same time recognizes -- following Husserl and Stein, for instance − that this formal element of experience is far from sufficient to account for the way we think of ourselves as persons, as socially embedded agents who find themselves in social settings, who take on roles, and who understand norms in terms of which they evaluate themselves, act the way they do, and thereby make themselves into the kinds of persons they are. This is the topic of Part II, where Zahavi takes as his positive point of departure insights from Scheler, Husserl, Stein, and Sartre on empathy and intersubjectivity in his rejoinder to various critics of the notion of empathy and to researchers who claim that it can be reduced to related phenomena like emotional contagion. He also tries to show how a phenomenologically oriented approach can avoid the pitfalls of the commonly accepted alternatives of a theory-theory of mind, on the one hand, and a simulation or mirror-theory on the other. It becomes clear how a philosophically informed and nuanced phenomenological reflection can helpfully inform empirical research that relies too easily on common but one-sided understandings of key conceptual terms.

In his discussion of various narrative or normative theories of the self, Zahavi finds much he agrees with as long as they don't overstep their bounds by making it seem as if the experiential self, or, to use Husserl's parlance, the "pure" or formal self, can be eliminated as a necessary element within those more complex and concrete understandings of ourselves and others. He argues that empathy, properly understood as a direct awareness of the mindedness of others, can appropriately account for self-other differentiation without having to overcome or eliminate it. He show how empathy can both respect the otherness of the other without making her emotions and actions somehow mysteriously inaccessible − contrary to our everyday experience, where we do often reliably recognize what another person is trying to do and whether that person is angry or happy not by inference but rather because of what we see and hear them say and do. Zahavi also stresses the contributions of Alfred Shutz for his insights into how we ourselves take on commonly understood social roles and recognize others in our daily interactions with them in terms of those roles. Another point of agreement between the phenomenological accounts of the self and other recent theories is the key role that temporality and historicity play in the constitution of selfhood. Part II closes with a chapter on recent research on face-recognition and the implications researchers have drawn from it about the presence or absence of self-awareness and other-awareness at various stages in a child's development. Here too, one of the key findings is that a closer and phenomenologically more differentiated reflection on some of the key operative assumptions in this work can be important in order to ascertain what the various results do and do not really tell us about how self-awareness and other-awareness develop within children (and work in adults too).

Finally, in Part III, Zahavi presents an extended discussion of shame, again in a critical discussion contrasting his own position with those of other recent theorists and empirical researchers. He argues for a more nuanced and less reductive account of the rich phenomena related to the experience of shame than many of the alternatives, and he shows why a fuller description will depend on many of the elements developed in Parts I and II, including experiential selfhood, empathy, as well as a thicker conception of self that includes social and normative understandings of oneself. In the final chapter, Zahavi tries to show how the results from Parts I and II also allow a better understanding of genuine second-person singular awareness and thus also of a plural "we-consciousness" too.

There are several impressive features of this book. First and foremost, it presents a coherent, cogent, and nuanced account of how we experience ourselves and others as minded, embodied, and embedded agents, as individuals and as members of groups and communities. Zahavi's positions are both phenomenologically and textually very well-informed as he works through the contributions of key figures from the phenomenological tradition on the issues he addresses. Equally impressive is the range of figures from outside of phenomenology, be it from analytical and other traditions of philosophy or from empirical psychology it introduces and discusses. In fact, the range is so broad that one could use this book as an introduction and overview of many of the leading competing positions on these issues in the philosophy of mind and other theories related to it in empirical disciplines today. At the same time, this can tend to make the book a little difficult to follow for someone not already well-versed in Zahavi's work, in at least some of the major figures within phenomenology he points to, especially Husserl, or in the recent literature in cognitive science on these issues. It is sometimes difficult to keep track of the sheer number of different positions that Zahavi cites to develop the points he wants to make in this wide-ranging and ambitious study.

Given the number of topics that Zahavi raises here, it is inevitable that many of the positions he advocates are indicated but not as fully developed as they might be in a more narrowly focused study. The great virtue of this work for anyone interested in these basic issues in contemporary philosophy and cognitive science is the way that Zahavi assembles so many of the leading theories and approaches and sorts through them clearly, recognizes their genuine driving insights, but also shows how they can benefit from a more nuanced and phenomenologically informed analysis along the lines of what he, following many others from 20th and 21st century phenomenology, has developed as examples of how careful phenomenological reflection can very positively inform current philosophical theories and contemporary interdisciplinary research in cognitive science.