Self-Awareness in Islamic Philosophy: Avicenna and Beyond

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Jari Kaukua, Self-Awareness in Islamic Philosophy: Avicenna and Beyond, Cambridge University Press, 2015, $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107088795.

Reviewed by Peter Adamson, Ludwig-Maximilians-Universität München


It used to be widely held that philosophy in the Islamic world ended in the twelfth century with the commentaries of Averroes. This is no longer the case, or at least it certainly shouldn't be. Of course, not all serious scholars of philosophy in the Islamic world actually work on the post-classical period. But anyone with competence in the field is now well aware that there is plenty of later interesting philosophy waiting to be studied. Indeed, the sheer quantity of philosophical works, many still available only in manuscripts, is daunting. So there is a need for several sorts of contribution: editions and translations, studies of individual thinkers, and longitudinal surveys of particular philosophical issues across the later period.[1] Jari Kaukua's book falls into the last category. It deals with the topic of self-awareness in Avicenna and his later readers in the Eastern Islamic world. The main authors in focus, apart from Avicenna (d.1037), are Suhrawardī (d.1191) and Mullā Ṣadrā (d.1649), with incidental discussion of Abū Barakāt al-Baghdādī (d.1160's) and Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (d.1210).

None of these are names that exactly need to be rescued from obscurity, and a reader keen to find fault might wonder whether some lesser known post-classical figures could have been integrated into the account. But any lack in historical coverage is more than compensated by the detailed and nuanced readings Kaukua offers for three main protagonists. The book demonstrates not only the centrality of self-awareness in Avicenna's psychology, but also the sophistication of his proposals and of the responses to those proposals made by later thinkers. It is also a timely publication, since the topic of self-awareness within and outside philosophy in the Islamic world has been receiving particular attention in recent years.[2]

Any treatment of the issue must start where Kaukua (after a survey of ancient materials on self-awareness) does: Avicenna's "flying man" thought experiment. We are asked to imagine a mature human created in midair, with no access to sensory input. Avicenna declares that this human would be aware of his own "self (dhāt)." That much is uncontentious. The trouble starts when we try to reach agreement on what Avicenna thought he had proven, or indeed whether he took the thought experiment to "prove" anything at all. When he sets out the scenario at the end of the first chapter of the Psychology section of his Healing, he labels it as a tanbīh: something that "calls attention." Avicenna infers from his thought experiment that the soul is immaterial, on the basis that the flying man is aware of himself but not his body, and "what is affirmed is different from what is not affirmed." But perhaps Avicenna sees this inference as something short of demonstrative, given the tanbīh label.[3] Compounding uncertainty about the goal and status of the thought experiment, it appears several other times in Avicenna's works with variations that may or may not be crucial. For instance, in one version you are asked to imagine yourself being created in this situation, rather than imagining the scenario in the third person.

For Kaukua, the purpose of the flying man is to "point out something present to the reader's experience" (34), namely "a concrete experiential sense of what the existence of the thing that functions as our soul could possibly be in separation from the body" (36). Given the themes of his study, Kaukua is more interested in the implication that humans have an ineliminable capacity for self-awareness than the scenario's probative value concerning the soul's immateriality. He duly insists (38-42), against the reading of Dag Hasse, that the flying man is indeed about self-awareness and not awareness of the soul's essence (dhāt, a word that appears several times in the passage, can plausibly be translated as either "self" or "essence"). Here one may need to distinguish between the purposes to which the flying man is put in Psychology 1.1 and its purposes elsewhere in Avicenna's works. Elsewhere, it does seem that Avicenna above all has self-awareness in his sights. But in the context of Psychology 1.1, I would agree with Hasse that it has a rather different function.

In the preceding part of this opening chapter, Avicenna has been taking issue with Aristotle's conception of soul as "form of the body." Aristotle's definition is all too plausible, Avicenna fears, because we typically grasp the soul indirectly by seeing it as the source of activities and powers realized through the body. But the soul is really a self-subsisting, immaterial substance, and its relation to the body is therefore ultimately incidental. Thus, the flying man (at least in this context) would seem to be intended to solve a methodological problem: if the soul is available to us only indirectly, how can we achieve the level of epistemic access to it that would be needed for the scientific inquiry that is psychology? The answer is that we have this access all along. This, on my view, is what the flying man shows: that the soul is epistemically available directly, rather than only indirectly via the body and its activities. Since this is how I take the passage, I find somewhat problematic a repeated feature of Kaukua's analysis. As evident from the quotations above (see also 63), Kaukua says that the flying man draws our attention to a feature of our experience. This is a potentially misleading term, since it could suggest that self-awareness is part of or continuous with sense-experience, and hence that the flying man is part of a wider empiricist project of Avicenna's.[4] Admittedly, this does not quite seem to be Kaukua's intention, but he does suggest that self-awareness is what remains of our experience once sensory input is removed (36). At best, this obscures the pivotal contrast between the direct non-sensory awareness we have of the soul and the indirect access we have through sensory experience.

One of the more surprising features of Avicenna's theory of self-awareness is his conviction that we are permanently self-aware, even when we are (paradoxically) not aware that we are aware (80). Thus he holds that we are self-aware even when drunk or asleep (or, presumably, both). For this reason Kaukua distinguishes between permanent, "primitive" self-awareness and second-order, "reflective" self-awareness (90). Since primitive self-awareness is a permanent feature of mental life, it may serve to individuate the self over time. In the strongest formulation, Avicenna is willing to say that self-awareness is the very existence of the individual (53). Avicenna seems to warm to this idea over time, and emphasizes it most in the infrequently read Taʿlīqāt. Of course one may ask what evidence we could possibly have that primitive self-awareness is permanently "there" in the background, since it is precisely awareness of which we are unaware. Kaukua may let Avicenna off too lightly here, since he finds it sufficient to say that we have no evidence for a gap in awareness (84). Surely, the burden of proof is on Avicenna to show that self-awareness is uninterrupted, especially if he wants to use it to ground identity over time.

Kaukua is, plausibly, skeptical that merely being aware of one's existence could be a route to a grasp of one's own essence (39), but is less troubled by Avicenna's inference that the soul is a substance. I am sympathetic to the retort made by al-Rāzī and Abū Bakarāt (115-17): the phenomenon of self-awareness, whether primitive or reflective, seems insufficient to establish something as theoretically advanced as the substantiality of the soul. As Suhrawardī says, in being aware of myself I am not aware of any "thingness" (122-23). This is only one of a range of interesting points made by later thinkers in response to Avicenna. Kaukua does a nice job contextualizing Suhrawardī's treatment of self-awareness, as when he notes that Suhrawardī wanted to find a model for explaining both self-awareness and knowledge of other things that would capture God's mode of knowing (127). This model turned out to be the famous doctrine of "knowledge by presence." On this, I am more sympathetic than Kaukua to Heidrun Eichner's reading of Suhrawardī's (133). Eichner is, I think, right to say that Suhrawardī polemicizes against the Aristotelian and Avicennan notion that human knowledge is universal in character and that particulars can, therefore, only be known by subsuming them under universals.[5] His point, as I take Eichner to suggest, is that we do not really need to apply a relevant universal in order to know something. Universals are in any case purely mental constructs (in his language, they are iʿtibārī). So the connection between the intellect and a particular, like that between soul and body, is simply a direct "presence" of one particular thing to another.

No less interesting is the final section of the book, which looks at Mullā Ṣadrā. As on other topics, Ṣadrā engages extensively and critically with Avicenna on the issue of self-awareness. He argues that the phenomenon of self-awareness is linked even to lower psychological faculties, for which reason even a non-human animal deprived of sensation would be self-aware. (Kaukua calls this the "flying animal" thought experiment, 164-67. This is not the only context, incidentally, where Ṣadrā seeks to blur the stark Avicennan contrast between human and animal. He also argues that animals must have some perception of universals, since otherwise Avcienna's famous case of the sheep perceiving hostility in the wolf would be inexplicable.[6]) Ṣadrā thus makes self-awareness a pervasive feature of our rich mental life, rather than seeing it as a fundamental, content-less act that underlies all psychological activity. Indeed, we always grasp ourselves as active in some way, as thinking, feeling beings (196). As Kaukua nicely observes, for Ṣadrā we are to ourselves only what we have managed to become (221).

In all, the book is not only a significant contribution to our understanding of Avicenna's psychology. It also demonstrates the perspicacity and intrinsic philosophical interest of later thinkers of the Islamic world, especially in critique and appropriation of Avicenna. Kaukua's book exemplifies a trend in the field, which is in a sense parallel to a longer-standing trend in ancient philosophy. Late ancient commentators and critics of Aristotle are nowadays made the object of frequent and philosophically sophisticated analysis. The post-classical commentators and critics of Avicenna deserve no less.

[1] To mention only a couple of outstanding recent examples in recent literature, R. Pourjavady has brought attention to the previously little known al-Nayrīzī in Philosophy in Early Safavid Iran: Najm al-Dīn Maḥmūd al-Nayrīzī and his Writings (Leiden: Brill, 2011), and for a fascinating longitudinal study see K. El-Rouayheb, Relational Syllogisms and the History of Arabic Logic, 900-1900 (Leiden: Brill, 2010).

[2] See for instance D. L. Black, "Avicenna on Self-Awareness and Knowing that One Knows," in S. Rahman et al. (eds), The Unity of Science in the Arabic Tradition (Dordrecht: Springer, 2008), 63-87; T. Scarpelli Cory, Aquinas on Human Self-Knowledge (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013).

[3] This point was stressed by D. N. Hasse, Avicenna's De Anima in the Latin West (London, 2000), 80-92, and accepted by Kaukua, 34.

[4] See D. Gutas, "The Empiricism of Avicenna," Oriens 40 (2012), 391-436.

[5] See H. Eichner, "'Knowledge by Presence,' Apperception in the Mind–Body Relationship', in P. Adamson (ed.), The Age of Averroes (London: Warburg Institute, 2011), 117-40.

[6] F. Rahman, The Philosophy of Mullā Ṣadrā (Albany: SUNY Press, 1975), 228.