Selves: An Essay in Revisionary Metaphysics

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Galen Strawson, Selves: An Essay in Revisionary Metaphysics, Oxford UP, 2009, 448pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198250067.

Reviewed by Sydney Shoemaker, Cornell University



This brilliant and provocative book is about more than its title suggests. It contains substantial discussions of a wide range of metaphysical topics, including materialism, the notion of an object, the categorical/dispositional distinction, the subject/property distinction, and the nature and experience of time. But its central focus is on what selves would have to be and whether there are any. Strawson’s view, similar to a view he finds in William James, is that selves are what he calls thin subjects, entities distinct from “full human beings” which, because they exist only when there is experience, normally have very brief duration. This is the “Transience View of the self”. He ends by defending the view that each self is identical with the experience of which it is a subject and with the content of that experience.

The first part of the book he describes as phenomenological: it is concerned with how we “figure” ourselves in experience, leaving it open whether the selves figured actually exist. He lists a number of features that go into the way ordinary folk figure themselves, i.e., that go into what he regards as ordinary “SELF-experience” (he uses small capital letters), and then, using what he calls the “whittling argument” (supplemented with the “building argument”), pares this list down to a smaller list of features that are essential to SELF-experience, and give us the “minimal form of genuine SELF-experience”. What he calls the Equivalence Thesis says that “selves exist if and only if there is something that has the properties denoted by those thought elements that feature in every genuine form of SELF-experience” (p. 54). Something having these properties would be a “sesmet”. The second, metaphysical, part of the book argues that there are thin subjects, that these are sesmets, and so are selves. He is insistent throughout that he is a materialist, so he takes selves to be physical entities — what he calls “physical synergies” (he hopes that “the word ‘synergy’ can do some work against the staticist tendencies of our ordinary conception of objects”, and against our resistance to the idea that objects are processes and are dynamic in nature [p. 304]).

In ordinary human SELF-experience the self is figured as a subject of experience [SUBJECT], as a thing [THING], as something mental [MENTAL], as something single [SINGLE], including both single synchronically [SINGLES] and single diachronically [SINGLEd], or [PERSISTING], as an agent [AGENT], as something with personality [PERSONALITY], and as something distinct from, not identical with, the organism as a whole, the whole human being [DISTINCT]. Of these he argues that PERSISTING, AGENT, PERSONALITY, and DISTINCT are not essential. The single compound thought element composed of the rest is SUBJECT OF EXPERIENCE-AS-SINGLE-MENTAL-THING, or, for short, SESMET. So the question becomes, are there any sesmets, and if so what are they.

Strawson takes the most common view to be that selves are entities that are both inner and persisting. Given materialism, the most likely candidates for these are “brain-systems”, thought of as persisting neural processes underlying consciousness. But he thinks these fail to have unity conditions robust enough to make them genuine things, and so to make them sesmets. His own candidates, as I have said, are thin subjects — subjects whose existence at a time necessarily involves their being subjects of experience at that time, and exist only as long as the experiences exist. He thinks it is true by definition that there are such things. (I will come back to this.) Further, he thinks they qualify admirably for being sesmets. By contrast with brain systems, “a thin subject … considered at any given time, seems unbeatable as an example of mental unity, and therefore of physical unity, and therefore as a candidate for physical objecthood” (p. 375). He takes the synchronic and diachronic unity conditions of thin subjects to be the same as those of the experiences of which they are subjects, and is drawn to the surprising conclusion that thin subjects are identical with experiences, and with contents of experiences.

This last claim exemplifies a tendency, exhibited throughout the work, to embrace metaphysically heterodox views. He holds, for example, that the distinction between things and properties is metaphysically superficial, and that “objects are nothing over and above concretely existing properties” (p. 305). He also says that “an object is identical with its propertiedness” (p. 306) (without explaining exactly what he means by “propertiedness”). This view he attributes to Descartes. He also holds — and here he has my warm approval — that “an object’s dispositional propertiedness is identical with it categorical propertiedness” (p. 306). He agrees (almost) with Russell (in the The Analysis of Matter) that while we have immediate awareness of the intrinsic nature of our experiences “neither physics nor everyday experience of physical objects gives us any sort of knowledge of the intrinsic nature of non-mental reality” (p. 228) (he qualifies this agreement by allowing that structural properties can count as intrinsic). In a lengthy discussion he considers and rejects a number of theses, many of them associated with P.F. Strawson and Gareth Evans, about the conditions for having self-conscious thought: that one must have some conception of other subjects of experience, that one must have some conception of body, that one must conceive of oneself as being embodied, that one can distinguish between how things are subjectively and how things are objectively, that one must figure oneself as located in, and as tracing a particular experiential route through, a world that exhibits a certain degree of order and regularity, and so on. He also rejects the Empirical Criteria Thesis, which says that having genuine self-conscious thought about oneself requires having empirical criteria of subject identity. He is attracted by pansychism, although does not defend it here, and is inclined to agree with van Inwagen that “chairs and brains aren’t good enough examples of physical unities to count as objects, when metaphysics gets serious” (p. 221).

Strawson draws heavily on the William James of the Principles of Psychology, although he sometimes takes issue with him, as in his discussion of the “stream of consciousness”. He sees his view as akin to that of Hume, whom he frequently cites. Also frequently cited is Kant, especially the Paralogisms. Despite his materialism, he often cites Descartes as an ally, and in the last part of the book he takes seriously Spinoza’s view that, as he puts it, there is only one object. Other writers cited with approval include Leibniz, Fichte, Husserl, Nietzsche, Russell, and Nozick. Although clearly an analytic philosopher himself, he is generally dismissive of established views in current analytic philosophy of mind.

I turn now to worries that I have.

Strawson allows that there is a good sense in which full human beings are subjects of experience. But apparently he thinks that full human beings are subjects only in virtue of having spatiotemporal parts, namely thin subjects, that are subjects in a more fundamental way (see p. 329). He thinks that the word “I” is ambiguous. Sometimes it refers to a full human being, while sometimes it refers to a self distinct from the full human being. (He sometimes marks the latter use by writing “I*”.) He must think that this ambiguity thesis protects him from incoherence when he says things like “when I think and talk about myself, my reference sometimes extends only to the self that I am, and sometimes it extends further out, to the human being that I am” (p. 31). This seems to say that he is (is identical with) two distinct things, a self and a human being, which on the face of it seems incoherent. Do we avoid the incoherence by saying that second and third occurrences of “I” have different referents? But then what does the first “I” refer to? And how to make sense of “In one respect, of course, we are thick subjects, human beings considered as a whole … In another respect, though, we are, in being subjects of experience, no more whole human beings than hands or hearts” (pp. 328-9)? Surely “we” has to be univocal here, but that lands us in saying that we are, in different respects, different objects. What can that mean?

Usually it is human beings that Strawson contrasts selves with. The notion of a person only occasionally occurs. Sometimes he seems to equate “person” and “self”, as when discussing a quote from Henry James in which he says he thinks of the author of one of his earlier books as a different person (p. 9) (implausibly, Strawson takes this literally). More commonly he seems to link “person” and “human being”. At any rate, he presumably thinks that if persons are what he in one passage refers to as “Strawsonian persons”, subjects of both mental and physical properties, but are taken to have psychological identity conditions (a la neo-Lockean views), they are distinct from selves as he conceives them. He says repeatedly that by definition selves are entities distinct from human beings (he says, p. 18, that “selves” can for most purposes “by replaced by ‘subjects of experience that are not the same thing as a human being considered as a whole’”), and I think he intends that they are, by definition, distinct from persons so conceived.

This poses a problem, given his elimination of DISTINCT from the essential features that characterize SELF-experiences and determine what would make something a sesmet. Why shouldn’t persons count as sesmets, given that sesmets needn’t be figured as distinct? They are conceived as subjects of experience, and as single mental things (where all that is required for something to be mental is that it be mentally propertied). And if persons are sesmets, we needn’t look for something “inner” to play that role. Strawson no doubt thinks about persons what he thinks about human beings — that they are subjects of experience only in a derivative way, by having spatiotemporal parts that are subjects of experience. Nevertheless that is something he is not entitled to say prior to establishing that the best candidates for being sesmets are things other than persons. He may be considering this possibility when he says that “the point that SINGLE-AS-SUBJECT is a necessary element of SELF-experience leaves room for the possibility that one might have SELF-experience even if one thought of oneself as subject of experience in the whole-organism sense of the term”, and goes on to say “But this isn’t a real possibility, or so I claim: one must in SELF-experience figure that self as it is in the living present of experience not only as single-as-subject but also single-as-subject-as-mental — however else one does or doesn’t figure oneself” (p. 166). But while there are perhaps conceptions of the “whole-organism” sense of “subject” on which the whole-organism cannot be figured as single-as-subject-as-mental, it is unclear why persons cannot be so figured, on the neo-Lockean conception which gives them mental unity conditions.

I turn to the claim that sesmets, and selves, are thin subjects. This will be plausible, perhaps certain, if there are thin subjects. But I don’t think we are given any good reason for thinking there are. What he claims to be true by definition is that if experience exists there are thin subjects. Certainly experience exists, and it is surely necessarily true, whether or not true by definition, that an experience must have a subject. But whence the requirement that it have a subject that exists only when it is a subject of experience? What Strawson says is that this "makes room for a natural use of the term ‘subject’ according to which it is a necessary truth, no less, that there can’t actually be a subject of experience, unless some experience exists for it to be a subject of at that time" (p. 329). Now there is such a natural use; if Louis (Strawson’s sample person) is sound asleep he is not then having any experience, and it is natural to express this by saying that there is nothing in what Strawson calls the “L-reality” that is then a subject of experience. But that is not to say that what at other times is the subject of Louis’s experience does not exist when he is sound asleep. (Why shouldn’t this be Louis himself?) Understood one way thin subject would be a “phase sortal”, like husband. Something cannot be a husband without having a wife, but what is a husband can exist without having a wife. So there is no reason why a person or human being cannot at various times in its existence be a thin subject of experience, in the phase sortal sense, while at other times, e.g., when sound asleep, not being one. What Strawson needs is a sense of “thin subject” in which it does not stand for a phase sortal, one such that a thin subject necessarily exists only when a subject of experience. He has given us no reason to think there are thin subjects in that sense.

Strawson frequently interrupts his text with objections, printed in smaller type, and in one of these he raises what seems to be pretty much the objection just raised. To quote from the objection,

How about the thin conception of an eater according to which … an eater doesn’t and can’t exist at any given time unless it is eating at that time? A (possibly fat) thin eater is just one of those silly putative objects that scholastic metaphysicans like to play with. It is of not interest or use in philosophy, and your thin subjects seem just as silly (p. 328).

(A footnote at this point expresses “Thanks to John Broome, who was more courteous.”) Strawson’s response to this is puzzling. He says that his claim that a subject of experience is something that exists only if experience exists of which it is the subject “cannot by itself do the work of showing that the part or portion of reality picked out by the thin conception of the subject is (unlike the thin conception of an eater) philosophically interesting or important” (p. 328). No doubt he thinks that things he says later do the rest of the work. But whether what is picked out is “philosophically interesting or important” is beside the point; the point is that at best what is picked out is a phase in the existence of something that, for all we have been shown, may exist at other times.

Earlier in the book Strawson prepares us for his introduction of thin subjects by discussing how he experiences himself. While allowing that some people are “Endurantists”, and intuitively “figure the self as something that has long term diachronic continuity”, he himself is an “Impermanentist”, one for whom

the Persistence Belief is not experientially natural … [and] whose natural, regular, lived sense of things is that the self they now experience themselves to be is not something that was there in the remoter past or something that will be there in the further future, although they are of course fully aware of their long-term continuity as human beings considered as a whole (p. 221).

He doesn’t feel that yesterday’s consciousness

belongs with my present consciousness in such a way that I think that it was I* who was there yesterday (I have no Connectedness Experience) … Nor do I judge, or feel, that it is I* who was there yesterday. On the contrary, I judge — feel — that I* certainly wasn’t there (I have no Persistence Belief)… . My memory of the experience of falling out of a punt last year, for example, has an essentially from-the-inside character … but it doesn’t follow, and in my case isn’t true, that it carries any sense at all that what is remembered happened to me*; to that which I now apprehend myself to be when apprehending myself specifically as a self (pp. 225-226).

I find it hard to credit these remarks. If someone tells me that he experiences himself as an immaterial substance, I won’t doubt his sincerity, but I also won’t believe what he says. I feel the same way here. I have no conception of what experience of the sort described would be like if it were not pathological. And in general, I am skeptical of talk about how we experience ourselves, about what we experience ourselves as, or about what the self presents itself as. This can easily go with a perceptual model of introspective self-knowledge which I think is misguided and which I don’t think Strawson accepts. For my own part, the only sense I can give to “SELF-experience” is being in states with first-person content. Strawson would agree that some of these states have contents that reach into the past and into the future, and I don’t think that we have been given any reason to think that their first-person-hood is different from that of those with present tense content.

There is the suggestion in the early part of the book that resistance to the notion of an inner self is linked with downplaying or denying the richness of our inner mental lives, something that is encouraged by excessive stress on what he calls the EEE (for “profoundly environmentally embedded, embodied, ‘enactive’, ‘ecological’”) aspects of our “experiential predicament as organic and social beings situated in a physical world” (p. 23). Those who think that

in normal human experience the external world occupied the field of consciousness in such a way that we normally have no awareness of the phenomenon of our awareness … utterly falsify the extraordinarily rich, rapid, nuanced, complexly inflected, interdipping flow of everyday experience (p. 26).

Here he seems to me to be attacking a straw man. One doesn’t have to be a crypto-behaviorist in order to hold, as Anthony Kenny does in a passage Strawson quotes, that “‘The Self’ is a piece of philosopher’s nonsense consisting in a misunderstanding of the reflexive pronoun” (p. 21).

Having voiced my doubts and misgivings, I should repeat that I found this an impressive book. Throughout the level of philosophical intelligence is very high, and the discussion is historically and scientifically well-informed, and often insightful and illuminating. The phenomenological observations, for example those in the discussion of the stream of consciousness, are often very acute. The writing is often brilliant. Despite the felicitous style, the complexity of the issues and the arguments make it not an easy book to read. But it is a rewarding book to read, even for those, like myself, who are unpersuaded by its central claims.