Sensory Blending: On Synaesthesia and Related Phenomena

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Ophelia Deroy (ed.), Sensory Blending: On Synaesthesia and Related Phenomena, Oxford University Press, 2017, 318pp., $67.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199688289.

Reviewed by John O'Dea, University of Tokyo


Philosophers are often captivated by psychological phenomena that strikingly contradict our expectations, and philosophical cottage industries can spring up around them. The discovery of "blindsight" was my first experience of this: people with blindsight act as though they are perceptually aware of something but report no conscious experience of it. Get thee behind me, Functionalism! -- or so some argued. But the problem was that 'blindsight' awareness is not functionally the same as regular awareness: the 'sight' that survives took statistical analysis of a forced choice task to uncover (Overgaard, 2012). On closer inspection, it was harder to know what blindsight meant for theories of consciousness. Some philosophers still pursue the empirical details hoping it will yield a clue about the nature of consciousness. Others have tried to make progress by extrapolating from actual blindsight to a merely conceptually possible condition that blindsight seemed to point toward -- super blindsight -- which may be revealing about consciousness at a conceptual level. In the end, blindsight did not lead to a revolution in thinking about consciousness, but it remains puzzling and thought-provoking.

Something similar has happened with synaesthesia, which has recently captured philosophical, as well as popular, interest. If you've come across synaesthesia -- the psychological phenomenon, as opposed to the band, or the album, or the skin cream, all of which exist -- it might have been via books like The Man Who Tasted Shapes, or the children's book The Girl Who Heard Colours. Like "blindsight", these descriptions do look philosophically puzzling. If colours can be heard, philosophical theories of colour which connect it to particular visual experiences are certainly in trouble, and the whole question of what makes a sense modality is up for grabs. It is not surprising that philosophers' attention was piqued. But just as for blindsight, the phenomenon itself is more complicated and less revolutionary than it seemed at first. It is probably not apt to say that synaesthetes literally hear colours; rather, sounds cause colour experiences for people with this type of synaesthesia. The difference is philosophically stark, since anomalous causal pathways to a colour experience are nothing to write home about, philosophically speaking. Or at least philosophical theories of colour, and of sense modalities, are out of immediate danger.

Nevertheless, synaesthesia provides plenty of food for thought. In a parallel to "super blindsight", Mohan Matthen in this volume discusses a hypothetical condition we might call "super synaesthesia" to interrogate the question: could there be a colour experience that counts as a perception of a sound? Matthen's chapter, and Michael Sollberger's rebuttal in the following chapter, are the closest to traditional philosophical questions. The other chapters are mainly trying to arrive at a better understanding of actual-world synaesthesia itself.

The major philosophical task undertaken in many of the chapters is also a traditional one: to distinguish the phenomenon at hand from superficially similar phenomena. The difficulty is that we don't know much about synaesthesia at a deep level. The name itself is a technical one, so there is not much point to a conceptual analysis (though Jonathan Cohen does attempt this in a limited way, mistakenly in my view). The working definition of synaesthesia is bound to evolve as we find out more about the underlying processes. Nevertheless there are good and bad working definitions, and there is a lot of interesting discussion in this volume trying to sort this out and adjudicate borderline cases.

The question of most interest to most of the authors here is: what causes synaesthesia? Obviously this is an empirical question, and indeed many of the authors would describe themselves as scientists rather than philosophers. On the other hand, since there are almost no original results presented the distinction largely breaks down (as it does in the case of some of the individual authors who work comfortably in both disciplines, especially Ophelia Deroy, Berit Brogaard, Yasmina Jraissati and Frédérique de Vignemont). What matters is the quality of argument, not results, and as far as that goes the philosophers included who engage with the existing science clearly have a contribution to make in uncovering the underlying explanation for synaesthesia. This was one of my favourite aspects of the book.

Since the book is fourteen chapters on (generally) quite separate aspects of synaesthesia, it resists easy synopsis. In what follows I will briefly describe the chapters.

After the editor's Introduction, it begins with a lucid and entertaining history and summary of what we currently know about synaesthesia by one of its most prominent researchers, Lawrence E. Marks. One common misconception of synaesthesia is that it is basically a cross-modal phenomenon. Marks points out that although it can be cross-modal, it usually isn't. The most common form of synaesthesia by far (grapheme-colour synaesthesia) is not cross-modal. The bewildering varieties of sensory blending described by Marks do highlight the question of whether the kinds of phenomenon usually labelled "synaesthesia" are coherent and distinct enough as a group to warrant the implication that they form a natural kind. This question is discussed in many of the chapters. "Synaesthesia proper" might be distinguished from two different phenomena exhibited by synaesthetes and non-synaesthetes alike: (1) cross-sensory interactions in ordinary perception, as when we hear a sound to be coming from the source visibly most likely (the cause of the ventriloquist illusion); and (2) cross-sensory associations that non-synaesthetes and synaesthetes often make: busy colour patterns look "loud", lemons have a "sharp" taste, and so on. These associations are unlike synaesthesia in that they are less specific, less automatic, and not consciously experienced, but do strikingly resemble in content.

Casey O'Callaghan points out in chapter two that as a general property of how the brain processes perceptual information, cross-sensory interactions are very much a feature, not a bug. For example, sound perception has relatively high temporal resolution but relatively low spatial resolution, and vision is the other way around; therefore, when we hear a sound the heard direction of the apparent source takes visual cues into account. In general, this makes audition more accurate. But sometimes the visual information is misleading and creates an illusion, as in the ventriloquist illusion. Synaesthetic experiences are also illusory (though see the Matthen/Sollberger discussion in this volume), but O'Callaghan argues that whereas (non-synaesthetic) cross-modal illusions are useful in studying how perception works, synaesthetic experiences are less obviously revealing in this way, so it is useful to keep synaesthesia and the more common cross-sensory interactions separate.

Cohen doesn't engage directly with O'Callaghan's argument, but otherwise is a companion chapter in that Cohen pulls together a wealth of argument and empirical data in the cause of his defence of the "continuity" or "continuum" hypothesis, which is that synaesthesia differs only in degree, and not in kind, from the cross-sensory interactions and associations in ordinary perception.

Among the many excellent chapters, Jraissati's stands out for its clarity and brilliance. This chapter engages closely with a debate about the underlying cause of grapheme-color synaesthesia, in which a specific color is experienced when perceiving a letter or digit. In the course of this engagement, Jraissati touches on many broader issues, from the "continuity" hypothesis to the limitations of Berlin and Kay color typology. Grapheme-color synaesthesia is interesting because it involves a cognitive element: language. This gives at least three interacting systems: shape perception, color perception, and language processing. Just how these interact in this form of synaesthesia is, to put it mildly, a complex problem. The complexity is only increased when one includes the evidence that non-synaesthetes also exhibit similar synaesthesia-like associations. When asked, native English-speaking non-synaesthetes tend to associate the letter "b" with the color blue, and the letter "p" with purple. Jraissati takes us through two competing theories attempting to explain all this. These theories assign differing importance to color language, on the one hand, and color appearances on the other. There is not enough space here to describe Jraissati's wonderful analysis of the debate, but she ends with a proposal of her own, involving the idea of perceptual salience, which (she argues) incorporates both competing approaches.

Myrto Mylopoulos and Tony Ro argue that synaesthesia may be another useful tool in the study of consciousness. For example, they discuss a study on a variety of auditory-visual synaesthesia in which people experience color sensations when they hear certain sounds. In this, participants were found to be having synaesthetic color sensations without any increased activation in V1, the primary visual cortex. Prima facie, this seems to be evidence against views which impute a necessary role to V1 in the production of conscious visual experience.

Brogaard's chapter focuses again on grapheme-colour synaesthesia. Contrasting early-processing with late-processing explanations of grapheme-colour synaesthesia, she notes that both have an element of plausibility and yet also serious explanatory challenges. On the one hand, perceptual pop-out effects suggest early sensory involvement; on the other hand, it has also been found that the synaesthetic colour experienced is subject to the McGurk illusion (in the classic experiment, hearing "da" when looking at a video of someone saying "ga" paired with the sound "ba"). The McGurk illusion requires integration between vision and audition, which is evidence that it happens relatively late in perceptual processing. Brogaard's third option is suggested by a striking study of a group of eleven grapheme-colour synaesthetes which found a strong match between synaesthetic colour-letter matches and the colours of a common set of letter-shaped fridge magnets, which ten of the participants had interacted with as children. In addition, in contrast to the previous chapter, Brogaard puts forward evidence that grapheme-colour synaesthetes may have a hyperactive primary visual cortex. This suggests, Brogaard argues, that learning and memory have a role in the explanation of at least this variety of synaesthesia: the sight of letters triggers a memory of the colour, which triggers the primary visual cortex, resulting in an actual colour experience. This chapter focusses on the same variety of synaesthesia as the Jraissati chapter, and in a similarly impressive way brings apparently competing lines of thought to converge on an alternative explanation.

Merleau-Ponty writes in Phenomenology of Perception that "synaesthetic perception is the rule" (2002, p.262). In his chapter, André Abath rejects this claim, but at the same time introduces a purportedly new form of cross-modal integration which is suggested by other aspects of Merleau-Ponty's writing. Abath rejects the quoted claim on the basis that Merleau-Ponty writes about synaesthesia as informative of its object. While an argument might be made for this about cross-modal correspondences, he argues, it is implausible for synaesthesia proper. A "colored hearing" experience is not, for synaesthetes, informative about the source of the sound (notwithstanding the hypothetical case Matthen describes). Merleau-Ponty's idea seems to be that an impression of an object through one sense will evoke a "quasi-sensory" impression of it in in other modalities. But this also contrasts with synaesthesia proper, Abath notes: there is often nothing "quasi" about synaesthetic sensory experience. Nevertheless, he does think we have something to learn from Merleau-Ponty which is relevant to the topic at hand, namely Merleau-Ponty's emphasis on the role of motor impressions (my expression, not his) in ordinary perception. The sense in which we see things as "graspable" (for example) qualifies, Abath argues, as a form of cross-modal integration. His argument for this involves an interesting analysis of the "quasi-sensory" cross-modal impressions that are purportedly involved, for example, in seeing a surface as hard, or hearing a sound as literally soft.

When a person synaesthetically experiences a letter as blue, we know that this is due to its being the letter it is, not the color it is. This suggests that synaesthetic color experience doesn't have the right causal connections to object color to be able to be truly perceptual. Matthen kicks off the first of two chapters of armchair philosophy by inquiring into the conditions that could, in principle, make a cross-modal experience genuinely perceptual. If a synaesthete experiences green when she hears middle C, could we regard this experience as the auditory/visual system's particular way of categorizing information about sound wavelength, and therefore as equally perceptual of sound wavelength as the sound experience? Matthen argues that we should, provided crucially and inter alia that (1) the greenness is perceptually present in some spatial location (as opposed to merely in the mind's eye), but (2) not present enough that there could be a conflict between the greenness of the sound and the greenness of any actual visible object. He offers colored after-images as an analogy, and concludes that we should not regard synaesthesia to be illusory by definition, even though it standardly is illusory.

Sollberger's chapter engages directly with Matthen's chapter, and argues that any experience that meets Matthen's second condition will not be perceptually present enough to offer itself as a reason to believe its content. After-images do not present to us as reasons to believe that anything is the color of the after-image, precisely because they do not seem real enough to conflict with anything in the visible world. Beliefs formed on the basis of an after-image-like experience would not be mere acceptances of the content of the experience, but would have to be inferences from that content to something else. Therefore, Sollberger argues, the kind of experience that Matthen describes would not be perceptual. It should be noted that Sollberger argues elsewhere that we should regard some actual cases of synaesthesia as genuinely perceptual. His beef here is with Matthen's in-principle argument, which is incompatible with that.

According to the continuity hypotheses, cross-modal associations like the "sharp" taste of a lemon are a less vivid, less specific, less automatic, less frequently experienced form of synaesthesia. An implication of this is that the key mechanisms responsible for synaesthesia are present in everyone, but somehow exaggerated in canonical synaesthesia. Thinking along these lines will clearly affect where we look for possible explanations. In their chapter, Deroy and Charles Spence argue that the similarities between synaesthesia and cross-modal associations only suggest an underlying common explanation if there are also in-between cases. But if we construct a multi-dimensional space whose dimensions are the respects in which synaesthesia and cross-modal associations differ (vividness, specificity, frequency and amount of control), there seems to be a clear clustering. This clustering suggests, they argue, that the eventual explanation for synaesthesia will be particular to it, and therefore it is more productive to research synaesthesia as a distinct phenomenon.

Devin B. Terhune, David P. Luke, and Roi Cohen Kadosh describe attempts to induce synaesthesia through training, hypnosis and drugs. None of the three approaches can replicate synaesthesia, according to the research they describe, but each can approximate it in different ways, and hold potentially useful data for uncovering the mechanisms behind synaesthesia. The authors hold out hope that post-hypnotic suggestion will be able to replicate the behavioral and phenomenological characteristics of synaesthesia. And if this can be done there may, for example, be less reason to take seriously explanations of synaesthesia which involve differences in brain structure, such as hyper-connectivity between brain regions.

Malika Auvray and Mirko Farina express skepticism about the prospects of drugs or post-hypnotic suggestion in mimicking synaesthesia, noting that the phenomenology reported in the hypnosis studies could be interpreted as a particularly vivid form of mental imagery, and that the number of participants who have reported this phenomenology is low. Auvray and Farina also describe the available data on two more kinds of cross-modal phenomena that are not elsewhere described in this volume, the use of odors to affect taste perception, and sensory substitution devices. They conclude that all of these cases are distinguishable in one way or another from synaesthesia, and urge that although it can be tempting to treat interesting cases as borderline forms of synaesthesia, it is better to be cautious on this front and not muddy waters (which are already fairly opaque) by rushing in to treat them as such.

De Vignemont's chapter is about a condition known as "Mirror-Touch Synaesthesia", or MTS, in which the sight of someone else being touched causes a sensation of touch on the corresponding part of one's one body. Despite the name, de Vignemont argues that MTS is not really a form of synaesthesia, on grounds similar to those spelled out by O'Callaghan and others in this volume: paradigm synaesthetic connections seem arbitrary, whereas there is an obvious logic behind MTS connections (from seen to felt touch on the same body part). Rather, de Vignemont argues that the basis of MTS is an inter-modal interaction that normally ensures more accurate perception. Her two main grounds for this conclusion are, on the one hand, a body of evidence that vision and visual imagination interact extensively with the sense of touch, usually to the benefit of the spatial acuity of touch, and on the other hand a further body of evidence that the brain makes use of a shared body schema for representing the self and other. Given this setup, de Vignemont argues, MTS is not too surprising. In particular, what is idiosyncratic about MTS is not the vision-touch interaction (which presumably provoked the inclusion of "synaesthesia" in the name), which is normal, but the self/other confusion. The existence of MTS may be further evidence for a shared self/other body schema, which would make this confusion less surprising.

Jraissati notes in her chapter that studies on grapheme-colour synaesthesia tend to work with an impoverished description of the data: usually just a colour name, from a restricted set of colour names for comparison. But synaesthetes tend to experience highly specific shades, and normally also textures. This specificity is one way in which synaesthesia differs from color associations made by non-synaesthetes. In the final chapter, Noam Sagiv, Monika Sobczak-Edmans and Adrian L. Williams note a further common feature of color-grapheme synaesthesia: personification. When letters and digits elicit color experiences, the letters and digits often also look gendered and to have more or less specific personalities, and this often spills over to the personification of objects. Sagiv et al argue that these impressions fit most of the standard characteristics of synaesthesia -- they are stable, specific and automatic. They are not sensory in the way that colour experiences are sensory, and for that reason Sagiv et al are cautious about characterizing the condition as synaesthesia. But there are strong arguments out there to the effect that there is a perceptual aspect to our awareness of others, so it seemed to me that they need not be so reticent. As with most of the phenomena described in this volume, the evidence for any particular explanation is too thin to point in any direction with confidence, but the authors speculate that misattribution of self-referential processing may be involved rather than social cognition as such.

For a while, the existence of synaesthesia seemed to show that the folk conceptual division of perception into different modalities was mistaken. The authors in this volume essentially all work within the existing conceptual framework without confusion, showing that this implication is false. However, it is one more example, if we needed one, that there are extensive causal and informational interactions between the different modalities, and indeed between perception and other functions, like belief and memory. Since synaesthesia seems to arise from these interactions, understanding it may involve understanding how the perceptual processing works in general. This makes the study of synaesthesia both extremely difficult and, I'm sure, extremely rewarding. It is also the study of a rare kind of aberrant brain process which is not a deficit -- indeed, the opposite -- and as Brogaard notes it may be as useful as lesion studies to research on specific aspects of perception.

This book embodies a wonderful continuum between doing science and doing philosophy. Though some chapters are more purely one than the other (insofar as one is comfortable saying that much), most are somewhere in between. All are very thought-provoking. Though the topic of the book is ostensibly narrow, the chapters within it engage with an enormous amount of research. Given this high volume of information being communicated, the papers tend to have a high bandwidth, so to speak. It might be tough going for a graduate class. But none of the authors assume much in the way of background information. Overall, this book is very highly recommended for anyone whose research has a passing connection to synaesthesia or other kinds of sensory blending.


Cytowic, Richard E. The Man Who Tasted Shapes. MIT Press, 2008.

Harris, Marie and Brantley-Newton, Vanessa. The Girl Who Heard Colors. Nancy Paulsen Books, 2013.

Overgaard, Morten. "Blindsight: recent and historical controversies on the blindness of blindsight." Wiley Interdisciplinary Reviews: Cognitive Science 3.6 (2012): 607-614.