Shapes of Freedom: Hegel's Philosophy of World History in Theological Perspective

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Peter C. Hodgson, Shapes of Freedom: Hegel's Philosophy of World History in Theological Perspective, Oxford University Press, 2012, 208pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199654956.

Reviewed by Mark Tunick, Florida Atlantic University


Peter Hodgson recently translated and edited, along with Robert F. Brown, what surely will be regarded as the most definitive English version to date of Hegel's lectures on the philosophy of world history.[1] Now Hodgson offers his own commentary on that work, taking advantage of the several sets of lecture notes made by students and auditors, as well as manuscript materials written by Hegel himself.

Hegel's approach as a theorist is to find order in apparent randomness, a goal he set for himself in writing his dissertation on the orbit of the planets and that motivated him throughout his life. He was impressed with the discipline of political economy for its ability to make sense of apparently random economic interactions. He aims to find order also when he studies world history. History may seem at first glance to be a succession of chance occurrences, but Hegel looks for essential connections so that individual events (though not every single one) relate to an end and therein obtain their significance and rationality.

Hodgson offers a valuable summary of the lectures in which Hegel gives a detailed account of the different "shapes of freedom" in the course of world history as they emerge in the Oriental, Greek, Roman, and Germanic worlds: in each world the people had a distinct consciousness that was expressed in and shaped by their institutions and laws. The earlier shapes of freedom are inadequate and necessarily take new forms until, in the modern world, appropriate institutions emerge that enable all individuals, in theory, to be free and recognize their freedom. While Hodgson acknowledges some limitations in Hegel's account, he is on the whole sympathetic with his view that history is a process in which human beings come more adequately to realize their potential as free beings. He faults Hegel for neglecting Africa and the Americas (92), and for sharing the prejudice of most Europeans of his time as to the cultural superiority of the Caucasian races (86); and he concedes that Hegel relied on 'biased' or 'ignorant' authors of travel or missionary accounts for information about other societies (86). But ultimately, for Hodgson, Hegel's "central plot concerning 'shapes of freedom' remains compelling" (92).

But this is not just a well-informed and enthusiastic summary of Hegel's account of world history. As is apparent from the book's subtitle, interwoven throughout and explicitly addressed in the final chapter is a particular interpretation of Hegel that is deeply theological. In his conclusion Hodgson reminds his non-Christian readers that "theology is an essential dimension of [Hegel's] thought, a dimension that is difficult to ignore" (179). He also believes that an approach to history ought to rely on theology: "Philosophy would be remiss if out of timidity it failed to take into account religious intuitions -- precisely the sort of timidity exhibited by a multitude of modern philosophers" (58). The book also takes up some puzzles raised by Hegel's philosophy of history: is Hegel a historical relativist? Does history have an end? But its focus is on presenting an interpretation of Hegel that is essentially theological and not humanistic. Along the way, Hodgson sometimes appeals to terminology likely to be unfamiliar to some readers, as when he says that Hegel gives to history a "surchronic structure" that is "not nontemporal or atemporal but more-than-temporal in the sense of an intensification of the temporal" (33). (Surchronic appears to be a word coined by Hodgson.) He also finds in Hegel an element of mysticism which may seem difficult to reconcile with Hegel's rationalism. For example, Hodgson writes that for Hegel the providence of God "is a mystery" and that when it "must come to speech" through the language of Vernunft (Reason), "what is communicated is precisely its mysteriousness, its inexhaustible, inconceivable rationality" (166); he refers, perhaps paradoxically, to Hegel's "rational mysticism" (57).

By way of introducing the debate over humanist vs. theological interpretations of Hegel, consider Hegel's claim that history tracks a progressive development of human beings. In Part 3 of his Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences (1830), he writes:

Just as in the living organism generally, everything is already contained, in an ideal manner, in the germ and is brought forth by the germ itself, not by an alien power, so too must all the particular forms of living spirit grow out of its concept as from their germ. In so doing, our thinking, which is actuated by the concept, remains for the object, which likewise is actuated by the concept, absolutely immanent; we merely look on, as it were, at the object's own development, not altering it by importing into it our own subjective ideas and fancies (Par. 379 Z).

While Hegel says the unfolding of the organism, or of spirit, does not occur through an "alien power," on the metaphysical and theological views there is a power beyond mere human will that is at work, a power that is not alien only because humans can identify with it. But on the humanistic reading, Hegel does not think there is actually some force at work external to human will that moves things along, or that God is a force in history. Robert Solomon, for example, argues that "Hegel is a strictly secular, virulently anti-theological, and more or less anti-Christian philosopher." For Solomon, the whole thrust of Hegel's philosophy is to demonstrate the strictly human context of human consciousness, "in which Nature and all gods but human spirit are relegated to a small and unobtrusive place."[2] That is an impression that some left-Hegelians had as well upon encountering Hegel. Ludwig Feuerbach wrote: "I had listened [to Hegel] for barely 6 months when my head and heart had been put right by him; I knew what I wanted and should do; not theology but philosophy! Not to drivel and rave but to learn. Not believe but think."[3]

Those taking the theological view, of course, disagree. For Hodgson, Hegel's position is that history is ruled by providence. What else could Hegel mean in saying that "this final end [of world history] is what God has willed for the world" (L 146, cited at 24)? The absolute thing that history is about "can only be expressed theologically" (58). Hodgson rejects any reading of Hegel that sees divinity as a "self-projection of the finite" (77) and notes that theologians "cringe" at references to spirit being a strictly human product (30). Without the theological level we have "the contingent fact that humanity has arrived at a certain self-interpretation, and we lack resources for confronting the tragic depth of history. One has to respect those for whom this is the most that can be said . . . but it is not Hegel's own view" (30).

Hodgson recognizes that a humanistic reading of Hegel is not uncommon. He cites Terry Pinkard's as typical of the view of "many if not most Hegel scholars of our time": there is nothing outside reason; it is not nature or providence that has been pushing us around but we ourselves (28-9). He even suggests that the humanistic reading accounts for what has been called the puzzling Hegel renaissance (29). Hodgson does not want to ignore the humanistic interpretation; but he wants to recognize it only insofar as it is integrated by Hegel with an ontological-theological account. For Hodgson, in contrast to left-Hegelians such as Feuerbach, Bruno Bauer, and Karl Marx, Hegel "insists on the objectivity of the divine nature and its irreducibility to human nature" (143).

Without evidence in which Hegel explicitly reveals his intentions, this debate may rest on competing interpretations of numerous passages. A difficulty presents itself because in many of his works Hegel conveys perspectival viewpoints -- accounts of what seems to be the truth given a particular form of consciousness. Read one way an account of truth might be taken just as that, but it might be intended only to reflect truth as understood from a perspective that Hegel regards as limited. For example, Hodgson cites L 168 in which Hegel says: "The purpose of spiritual activity is the glorification and honor of God. Here the matter is comprehended in religious terms" (58). In L 146, cited above, Hegel says God has willed the final end of world history; but the passage continues: "Here we must abstract from the religious expression and grasp the concepts in the form of thought" (cited at 24). The theological and humanistic interpretations differ in that on the latter view, to comprehend concepts in religious terms is for Hegel not fully adequate; that understanding can be superseded. Hodgson relies to a large extent on Hegel's 1829 Lectures on the Proofs of the Existence of God (142), which he has translated and edited (Oxford, 2007), in which Hegel takes up man's connection with God abstractly as a connection of the finite with the infinite, and discusses the idea of absolute necessity. Still, I am not sure that humanists such as Solomon would find anything in that work that fundamentally distinguishes it from Hegel's other lectures discussing religion and God that would lead them to rethink their interpretive approach.

Hodgson makes an impressive case for the theological reading of Hegel, and beyond that, offers us an invaluable guide to the philosophy of history and its source material. But there may be some instances in which his commitment to a theological interpretation yields a Hegel who will be unfamiliar. Hodgson takes up the question of why bad things happen in a world governed by reason (and on the theological view, by God). He answers that events such as the shooting of Representative Giffords and the killing of six others at a "Congress on Your Corner" rally in Arizona don't result from the will of God or reason. Still, Hodgson tries to find purpose in such events on behalf of Hegel, arguing that "the final end would build on the residue of this shaking event as people reflected on their own mortality" (27-8). But Hegel doesn't think we must find meaning in every aspect of existence. It's fairly well known that Hegel made light of Wilhelm Krug's challenge to deduce the existence of a particular pen from the Idea. Hegel responded that philosophy need not explain every contingency (Werke II: 188-207). Crime exists in the world. It may even be essential that there is some crime, for this necessitates a state and legal institutions that vindicate right and through which people come to the consciousness of their freedom in ethical life. But Hegel does not think a particular crime needs to have a purpose.

Hodgson also seems to invoke his theological conception to suggest that Hegel does not endorse a separation of church and state. He notes that in the manuscript of 1830 Hegel says it is "foolish . . . to devise and implement political institutions independently of religion" (67) and that the state's foundation cannot be purely secular (79). Hodgson then characterizes the view that Hegel's state can be neutral about religion as a "pretense" (79). But while Hegel does say the state rests on the foundation of religion, this may mean only that he thinks the principle of subjectivity which is essential to individual freedom in a modern state would not have arisen historically without the rise of Christianity. I think it is clear, though, that Hegel does insist on a wall between church and the modern state.[4]

Hodgson gives a comprehensive account of Hegel's philosophy of history that lends insight into a number of issues Hegel's work raises. One of the most interesting is whether Hegel is a historical relativist (61). Hodgson speculates that while shapes of freedom do not coalesce into a single shape, cooperation among shapes could produce new religious and philosophical theories. If there is an argument that would have most benefitted from further development in this book, it might be this one. On one view, the institutions of ethical life that Hegel discusses in the Philosophy of Right (private property, contract, monogamous marriage, civil society, hereditary monarchy) are, for Hegel, essential for the development of freedom and it is no accident they arose. (Hodgson refers to Hegel's "preference for the monarchical constitution"[139], but hereditary monarchy was not Hegel's preference; he claimed it was necessary.) If that is the case, we would not expect a future in which communal property, minimal marriage, or an elective monarchy would be possible as these would not provide the means necessary for people to realize their freedom.[5] On the relativist reading, in contrast, if people could be at home in alternative institutions, those institutions would be rational. Hodgson resists tackling this issue directly, saying only that prediction is not the business of history or philosophy (62).

Hodgson is critical of the humanist interpreters of Hegel: "Lack of familiarity with this theological trajectory, and with Hegel's deep involvement in the theological debates of his time, has hampered recent philosophical critics of Hegel who assume that theology is simply an antiquarian or esoteric hobby" (147). Many of the scholars who read Hegel humanistically are aware that Hegel was engaged in theological debates and that Hegel may well think that God is ultimately at work in the course of history.  But they could think that such a view may be unacceptable at least as a shared public basis for justification when making political or moral arguments concerning what is right or what constitutes freedom, and so they may appeal to a rehabilitated or revised Hegel. Hodgson is himself willing to rehabilitate Hegel when he argues that while Hegel did not endorse a "pluriform vision" in his own time, it is conceivable he would have in ours. Hegel, argues Hodgson, was aware of the diversity of determinate forms of spirit, and so he might have been able to integrate non-Western instantiations of freedom (40). If Hegel is not a historical relativist, as I have just described that position, he may think there are objective criteria that institutions must satisfy if we are to be free, in which case it is not a given that non-Western "shapes of freedom" would satisfy Hegel. Still, Hodgson's willingness to adapt Hegel to changing times is laudable. If Hodgson's theological interpretation of Hegel is correct, the question would remain whether Hegel would need to be modified in order genuinely to contribute to discussions of freedom and right in states governed by the theory of political liberalism, which insists that public conceptions of justice not rely on comprehensive doctrines others may not share.[6]

[1] Robert Brown and Peter Hodgson, eds., Lectures on the Philosophy of World History, v. 1 (Oxford: Clarendon, 2011). 'L' refers to the lectures of 1822-3 in citations below.

[2] Robert Solomon, In the Spirit of Hegel (NY: Oxford University Press, 1983), 5; cf. 198-99, 256:"God is nothing more than our (collective) recognition of 'Him' (i.e. of ourselves as Spirit)".

[3] Günther Nicolin, Hegel in Berichten Seiner Zeitgenossen (Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1970), 269, 292.

[4] I develop this point in Mark Tunick, "Hegel and the Consecrated State," in Angelica Nuzzo, ed., Hegel on Religion and Politics (NY: SUNY Press, 2013).

[5] On the idea of 'minimal marriage', see Elizabeth Brake, "Minimal Marriage: What Political Liberalism Implies for Marriage Law," Ethics 120(2):302-37 (2010).

[6] John Rawls, "The Idea of an Overlapping Consensus," Oxford Journal of Legal Studies 7(1):1-25 (1987).