Simultaneity and Delay: A Dialectical Theory of Staggered Time

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Jay Lampert, Simultaneity and Delay: A Dialectical Theory of Staggered Time, Continuum, 2012, 272pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441126399.

Reviewed by Felix Ó Murchada, National University of Ireland, Galway


Time, as Augustine's oft-quoted remark on the subject makes clear, is both immediately evident and conceptually opaque. Subjective and intersubjective experience, action and contemplation, mortality and immortal desire, all seem to be inescapably temporal; however once we attempt to conceptually articulate this temporality, in particular once we attempt to give a unified account of it, aporias seem inevitably to emerge. In this book Lampert recognises the irreducibility of these aporias and shows how on the basis of that recognition we articulate a theory of time which is true to temporal experience itself.

The title sets out the four pillars of Lampert's account: simultaneity, delay, dialectics, and staggered time. The last term refers to a non-unifying, aporetic unity peculiar to time. In a key passage Lampert writes: "if the best philosophies of time produce aporias, they are time's own aporias . . .  It is not that we do not know what to think about time; it is that the solution to what time is may contain contradictory properties." (150) If this is the case, then to think about time means to change the way we think.

Lampert begins by outlining three methodologies. The first is to weave together phenomena from a wide range of sources to produce a conceptual description which can account for this range -- from science to art, from simultaneity to delay. The second is "to uncover a conceptual order" in the history of "unsystematic analyses of simultaneity and delay" (2) from Plato to Deleuze. The third is to systematize the results in the form of a kind of transcendental deduction. Lampert's goal is to uncover a "complex timescape" (2). The ambition of the book then is nothing less than to develop a theory of time which gives the principles whereby an account of divergent phenomena, from the illusion of movement in sculpture to delayed reactions to trauma, can emerge. The emphasis here is on the formal structures which can be uncovered both by phenomenological and non-phenomenological approaches.

For Lampert, Husserl posed the fundamental problems of simultaneity and delay in phenomenological terms, problems which were solved only on the "outer edges" of phenomenology by Derrida and Deleuze. With respect to simultaneity the problem is that inner time consciousness functions as a time flow, constituted by a series of retentions and protentions of particular objects. In that case how do I experience several objects, with their own time flows, as occurring at the same time? Correctly, although in a manner which Husserl does not employ in the "Lectures on Internal Time Consciousness", Lampert emphasizes the role of anticipation-fulfillment here. The tempo of anticipation-fulfillment seems different between bringing a cup of coffee to my lips and reading a page of a book (23). But this plurality is one which, Lampert notes, Husserl continually attempts to cancel out in the form of a common 'now'. While not referring directly to it, the 'living present (Lebendige Gegenwart) is the target of his critique of Husserl. Ultimately, Husserl finds the source of simultaneity not in the object but in the synthesizing function of consciousness. It is for this reason that, as Lampert points out, simultaneity and temporal succession are inseparable for Husserl (29). This is clear in the account of memory, where a remembered experience is only possible on the basis of its expectation structure: in remembering driving to work this morning I remember my anticipation of reaching my office. My memory is of a not-yet fulfilled anticipation. Both in terms of my present experience and my memory of past experiences, simultaneity is achieved only in terms of delays within the temporal flows. What follows from this is that it is "in the nature of events, as intentional objects, to pass into the future in staggered deferrals." (35) How deep this delay goes then becomes a central question. It is one which Lampert sees as inadequately addressed by Merleau-Ponty and Heidegger (for different reasons). The solution needs to wait for Derrida and Deleuze, but before leading us through that, Lampert takes a long detour through ancient, medieval, modern and early twentieth century philosophy as well as Einsteinian science.

The chapter on ancient and medieval issues contains interesting discussions of time and eternity in Plato, Aristotle, Plotinus and Origen. It is, however, from a historical point of view strangely unbalanced. Medieval philosophers are hardly mentioned and two central figures in the transition to medieval accounts of time and eternity, Boethius and Augustine, are not discussed. Indeed, arguably Boethius's definition of eternity as "the complete, simultaneous and perfect possession of everlasting life" does not so much temporalize the distance between time and eternity (as Lampert sees Christianity doing (65)); rather it makes the gulf between time and eternity unbridgeable (except by divine grace).

It is in discussing Kant in the next chapter that Lampert sets out the position which the book as a whole problematizes and in doing so uncovers the relation of time and space implicit in the whole discussion. Kant distinguishes between spatial simultaneity and temporal succession with the aid of two examples: that of the house and that of the boat going down a river. For Kant simultaneity involves reversibility and return. But as Lampert points out simultaneity is based in this view on a hypothetical conditional and on delay: if I return from the hall to the kitchen, the kitchen would be there at the same time as the hall. This subjective test presupposes that there is simultaneity in the object, which means reciprocal causation. Such reciprocal causation will define space itself, because spatial relations require the simultaneous presence of all determinations of space to each other. But in that case succession becomes reduced to the hypothetical of movement between simultaneous places in space and the "movement of the boat through the river presupposes world-simultaneity just as certainly as do the rooms in the house." (82)

Lampert appeals to Hegel to show how individuated succession can be reconciled with general simultaneity. Crucial to Hegel's account is virtuality: as Lampert puts it, for Hegel "each spatial point must be determinable: it must have a time-river run through it; otherwise, it will not be differentiated from the spatial continuum." (87) He goes on to explain that for Hegel for there to be different spaces it must be possible to move through them, so "a multiplicity of space implies time" (87). The paradigm of simultaneity for Hegel is two places existing at the same time, rather than one big thing spread out (90).

Following an erudite discussion of relativity theory and contemporary developments in cognitive science Lampert enters the final stage of his detour in a discussion of Bergson. Bergson is with Husserl, for Lampert, a "great simultaneity philosopher". (147) Bergson roots simultaneity in acting or moving in space: when I grasp time I grasp the possibility of another consciousness at this time acting otherwise. The alternative is that 'even now' some other happening could occur in the fundamental sense of simultaneity for Bergson. What this means is that "in inner experience we cannot actually perceive simultaneously two things in different places in space; we can only perceive simultaneity virtually, by perceiving one event actually occurring and another event that belongs at the same time in principle, namely by seeing one event acted out and the other delayed." (132)

The key chapter then is the seventh, dealing with Derrida and Deleuze. It is to these two philosophers that we owe the solution to the problems thrown up by the philosophical (and indeed scientific) tradition: "If Derrida is right, delay precedes succession and Husserlian problems can be solved. If Deleuze is right, past and present coexist, and Bergsonian problems can be resolved." (149) Derrida and Deleuze are fundamental for Lampert because after "Derrida's post-phenomenology of temporalization and Deleuze's ontology of pure time, it is not longer possible to separate" (149) the topics of simultaneity and delay. Lampert shows how deconstructive delay substitutes for the Aristotelian now and is a solution for the problem of time. The 'now' is a contradiction, the coexistence of that which does not coexist. Derrida radicalizes Husserl's account of time-consciousness: "the implication Husserl did not anticipate is that we never see something in the now; we always see it in the now afterwards . . . . So simultaneity is always two different nows maintained at once." (154) The implication of this, however, is not, as it would appear, that "Derrida's philosophy is all about delay" (157), because what Derrida is questioning is precisely the continuous self-enclosed now which is the presumption of any "ethics of patience" (157).

Turning then to Deleuze, Lampert goes on to show that Deleuze makes explicit what is implicit in Bergson: that "simultaneity constitutes flow" (159). What Deleuze does is translate psychic terminology (pure memory) into ontological terms (pure past or pure time). For Deleuze the only way to explain the passing of time is that pastness is simultaneous with the present -- the now is both present and not present at once. Furthermore, Deleuze redefines past, present and future not as three ekstases of one structure of time but as three different coexisting structures of time, such that time is a "strange multilayered phenomenon, with three independent sets of structures that exist simultaneously." (162)

The next two chapters build on the work of Derrida and Deleuze to examine simultaneity and delay in politics and music. The chapter on politics examines in particular the work of Balibar and Badiou (in addition to that of Derrida and Deleuze) with a view to examining different and disparate variations on delayed simultaneity and simultaneous delay. The point here is not to choose between these variations, but rather to indicate that the very possibility of such variations, indeed the experimental quality of much of this writing, is rooted in the variations within the temporal structure itself. This is a theme Lampert pursues further in the penultimate chapter on music, where he shows how much of twentieth-century music can be understood as so many experiments with tempo and rhythm. As he puts it: "Simultaneity and delay in music and other arts are not parameters that limit what can or should be done but fields of experimentation with time as the sensible realm." (226)

In tandem with this emphasis on experiment, Lampert is also pursuing a transcendental argument. He makes this clear in the course of the discussion of music: "Experiments need to be followed up with transcendental deduction." (205) This is the least developed aspect of the book. Early in the book, in the context of the discussion of Husserl, he states: "I think it is possible to prove transcendentally that there must exist staggered processes" (27), but it is not until the short concluding chapter that Lampert attempts to explain such a transcendental proof. While acknowledging that a formal deduction does not guarantee concrete instances, he seeks to deduce structural possibilities of events and times. Limiting himself to one or two events and one or two times, he sets out the possibilities of temporal events. As he concludes, "there is not a single structure of time. But all structures of time are structured by succession, simultaneity and delay." (231)

The present reviewer would have liked the latter thought to be developed further, with perhaps more acknowledgement of diverging transcendental strategies. It is also not made clear how formal systematic analysis and phenomenological accounts can be reconciled. Furthermore, the discussion of the phenomenological authors is strangely truncated. Lampert relies exclusively on Husserl's "Inner Time Consciousness" lectures, whereas reference to some of the Nachlass editions could have shown a more nuanced account of time in Husserl and one which in certain cases anticipates Lampert's own discussions. Similarly, he forgoes investigations of the later Heidegger and later Merleau-Ponty in favour of an analysis of Derrida and Deleuze. Despite these concerns it is clear that this is a book of extraordinary richness and one which is indispensible for any philosopher interested in the perplexities of time.