Slaves of the Passions

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Mark Schroeder, Slaves of the Passions, Oxford University Press, 2007, 224pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199299508.

Reviewed by David Sobel, University of Nebraska-Lincoln


Mark Schroeder's Slaves of the Passions offers the best, most complete book-length defense available of a Humean conception of normative reasons for action. Part of what makes this book so needed, valuable, and worth celebrating is that it has had so few serious contenders for that title. But the book's virtues are not merely that it fills an exceedingly large gap in the literature. It is also wide-ranging, innovative, systematic, and rigorous. The Humean account of reasons for action enjoys the status as the one theory one must argue against before moving on to one's own view. It is, for many, the theory of practical reasons people love to hate. Its status is perhaps analogous to Consequentialism's status in normative ethical theory. It is high time the view got a sympathetic book-length explication and defense. All with a serious interest in assessing the Humean program are, in the strongest terms, advised to study this book. It is a really good book.

Schroeder starts from the simple and compelling thought that Ronnie, who likes to dance, has a reason to go to the party which Bradley, who hates to dance, lacks. There are different contenders to explain why Ronnie has and Bradley lacks such a reason, but the plausible ones will advert to non-normative psychological features of the two. Schroeder claims that however we best understand what explains why Ronnie but not Bradley has a reason to go to the party, all practical reasons can be explained in that same way. In the end, Schroeder argues that it is desires that are the relevant psychological feature of Ronnie that explain his reason to go to the party and so he thinks desires are needed to explain all practical reasons. But the book aspires to be much more accommodating of Kantian intuitions than one would expect, given the above description.

The book is wide-ranging and complex. It is not recommended for undergraduate classes. Briefly, here is an incomplete list of important themes from the book which will not receive further attention below. The Humean view, according to Schroeder, can appear to be either incoherent (our reason to serve our desires is itself contingent on our desires) or chauvinistic (the one reason that is not explained by our desires is the reason we have to serve our desires). To avoid this dilemma, Schroeder argues that desires explain reasons by facts about them partly constituting the correct analysis of reasons. He offers a reductive, non-normative analysis of what it is to be a reason in terms of desire. And there is a very interesting and helpful general discussion of reductive analyses. The book helpfully summarizes many of the most influential criticisms that have been launched against the Humean view in recent years and usually does so in a fresh, clarifying way.

The rest of this review will focus on two novel and central theses of the book: (1) Schroeder's novel account of what the reason is for Ronnie to go dancing (as opposed to what explains why there is a reason to go to the party), and (2) his response to two objections that argue that Humean views of practical reason are extensionally inadequate. Although I admire the book and am sympathetic to the Humean view, I find reasons to resist Schroeder's arguments on both of these two key topics.

What is the reason to go to the party?

Schroeder argues against the "No Background Conditions" view of reasons. The No Background Conditions view treats facts necessary to explain why something is a reason as themselves part of the reason. So, assuming a Humean view, since a desire for coffee must be in place for one to have an intrinsic reason to get coffee, the fact that one has a desire for coffee would itself be part of the reason for getting some. Schroeder's own alternative view stems from the attractiveness of the "Deliberative Constraint" which claims that when someone is deliberating well to a practical conclusion, the things she is thinking about are her reasons [26]. (This is a different thought from the familiar idea that one's reasons are determined by what one would want, or want for one's non-ideal self, after ideal deliberation.) And, it seems natural to say that a person who strongly desires coffee need not think about the fact that he desires coffee in good deliberation to the conclusion to go to the local coffeehouse. Joe might merely think, "there is coffee at the Mill" in deciding to go there and this thinking seems good. Schroeder thinks we should accept the Deliberative Constraint and thus claims that what is needed to explain why "there is coffee at the Mill" is a reason for Joe to go there, namely that Joe desires coffee, is not itself part of the normative reason.

I am not sold on the Deliberative Constraint or the way that Schroeder wields it and will offer some reasons to resist both. However, although the Deliberative Constraint is Schroeder's main weapon against the No Background Conditions View, we do not have to embrace the No Background Conditions View if we reject the Deliberative Constraint.

Schroeder seems to think that desires shape deliberation without entering explicitly into deliberation. And surely this is often the case. We do not tend to need to remind ourselves of our desire for coffee in the morning or the love of our spouse yet such things strongly shape deliberation. But Schroeder needs more than the thought that deliberation can count as good without making explicit one's desires. His argument appears to need the premise that such desires (at least in ordinary cases) must not figure in good deliberation. For if they did appear in good deliberation, then they would be part of the reason. But Schroeder tells us that only in non-standard cases (where satisfying the desire is the object of another, presumably psychologically backgrounded, desire) are desires part of the reason. [31-2]

But suppose that Joe, somewhat ploddingly, did explicitly rehearse that he likes coffee in the morning in his thinking about what to do first thing upon waking. While this would seem unusual, I myself would not want to say that the deliberation was not good. Or if I did want to say something against such deliberation it would only be that it is excessively plodding and wasteful of time and that it would be better for the agent to allow such premises to play their role without making such obvious desires explicit. [Contrast 27] That is, the complaint would be that there are pragmatic reasons for letting such desires play their role more automatically (assuming one is like most of us and can do so). But Schroeder claims that the person who merely thinks to themselves "there is coffee at the Mill" and heads off is not merely using shorthand or for pragmatic reasons not explicitly considering the desire. [28] And this I do not see. What would the complaint be about the deliberation of someone who did make their ordinary desire explicit in reasoning other than this was a waste of time? Schroeder thinks his view helps the Humean avoid the charge that good Humean deliberators are excessively self-involved (or have the "Pornographic Attitude"). But it does not seem importantly less self-involved to let one's desires play their motivational role unselfconsciously rather than letting them play the same motivating role via explicit deliberation. I would have said that self-involvement had to do with the content of one's desires, not their degree of consciousness. Also it seems odd for the Humean to say that deliberation counts as poor because it is self-involved. If quasi-moralized complaints about deliberation are permitted to shape what counts as good deliberation at this stage, then one wonders how in a principled way to resist letting morality in via this shortcut.

If we rejected the Deliberative Constraint it would be easy for the Humean view to avoid the charge of requiring the Pornographic Attitude simply by reminding us that the Humean view offers an account of the truth-makers of reasons claims, not a decision procedure. Further, if we are permitted but not required to explicitly attend to ordinary desires in good deliberation then, I guess, the Deliberative Constraint says that how we in fact happen to deliberate determines what does and does not count as the normative reason. Sometimes the only explicit thinking we do on an occasion is to remember that we previously concluded, for reasons we do not remember, that this is the thing to do. But surely our normative reason to do it is not that we previously concluded to do it. If the only reason that making such ordinary desires explicit does not count as good deliberation is because doing so is a waste of time, then it is hard to avoid the conclusion that our reasoning where desires are not made explicit is merely shorthand for the fuller story which does involve desires. And this is what Schroeder denies. [28]

Later Schroeder considers the person who explicitly takes into consideration very small and greatly outweighed reasons to perform some action. He tells us that he "thinks something would be going wrong if you even considered it." [96] And this seems right. But one wonders how to interpret the Deliberative Constraint so that it is compatible with such truths. Schroeder [130, n. 5] helpfully distinguishes the question of whether some consideration should enter into deliberation from the question of whether deliberation should take place. In an emergency, there is no time for explicit deliberation and thus it should not take place. But time pressures can also affect the sort of deliberation that should take place and not just whether it should take place or not. But it would be surprising if our normative reason was itself so shaped by the amount of time we had to deliberate. What should pass through our minds during good deliberation are the reasons which are worth thinking about given our time constraints, what we are likely to forget, and such. But if what counts as good deliberation is responsive to such concerns then it is hard to see such deliberation as anything but enthymematic (which is exactly what Schroeder is denying).

Good third personal deliberation about Joe's reasons in the above case will advert to the fact that Joe wants coffee. When I explain why Joe has a reason to go to the Mill it would be natural for me to consider the fact that Joe likes coffee and not merely where coffee is. This difference between good first and third person deliberation about practical reasons might suggest that the explanation why good first person deliberation need not make explicit reference to Joe's desires is because they are treated as too obvious to waste time consciously considering from a first person perspective but from the third person perspective such facts need not be so obvious and so are more worth spending time consciously considering. If such thoughts were on the right track then we might think that the phenomenon Schroeder calls our attention to is merely responsive to pragmatic considerations and not the key to understanding the metaphysics of what is the reason and what is not. Often our desires are so obvious to us and stable that there is no need to consciously remind ourselves of them just as we don't need to explicitly remind ourselves of our belief that water flows from the tap. But not all of our desires are like this. Sometimes we have to work to figure out what we want, or what we want in the relevant way. In these cases it will not be odd to consciously consider our desires.

Explanations in science seem to have broad pragmatic features. If normal background conditions include there being oxygen around, then a good answer to the question of why the fire started will not mention the presence of oxygen but will instead focus on the spark. But in contexts where sparks are part of the normal background conditions and the presence of enough oxygen to sustain a fire is uncommon, it would make sense to focus on the presence of the oxygen in explaining what happened. But none of this should be thought of as providing deep insight into the metaphysics of what caused the fire. To the extent that we think it is for similar reasons that good deliberation sometimes focuses on the non-obvious part of the full considerations which generate the reason, to that extent we should think that Schroeder has not provided good reasons to think that what we focus on in good deliberation plays a deep role in understanding what our reasons really are.

Schroeder offers several further considerations in favor of his view. He reminds us that in other contexts that which is required to explain why a thing is an F need not itself be part of the F. He reasonably claims that it sounds natural to say that a person's reason to go to the party might be that there is dancing there. However, it sounds just as natural to my ear to say that the person's reason to go to the party is that he likes dancing. But the consideration that Schroeder develops the most in favor of his view, besides the Deliberative Constraint, is his claim that rejecting the No Background Conditions View helps us respond more successfully to the Wrong Place Objection. [37-40] The Wrong Place Objection maintains that, regardless of whether the Humean view gets plausible extensional answers about what we have reason to do, it is just intuitively implausible that it is because a person has a desire for an option that she has a reason to get that option. The objection is that the Humean looks in the wrong place for what it is about us that generates our reasons. Hypotheticalism is claimed to be able to accommodate this worry because it says that the fact that a person desires something is not part of the reason for her to do it. But to the extent that I understand what someone is getting at with the Wrong Place Objection, it seems to me that such an objector would claim to have the same objection to views that allege that what explains why a certain consideration gives an agent a reason is that she has a desire for that option. It is hard to understand what someone might have had in mind with the Wrong Place Objection such that they are mollified to learn that the desire is not part of the reason but rather a necessary component in explaining why the consideration is a reason. I would have thought such an objector would be saying that our desires are the wrong place to look for a normative source for our reasons. And if this were their objection, Schroeder's move would not blunt it.

The Rejection of Proportionalism

The centerpiece of the book, in my view, is the way that it tries to avoid the counterintuitive extensional results that traditional Humean theories generate. The key to Schroeder's view here is his rejection of "Proportionalism". Proportionalism claims that "when a reason is explained by a desire, as in Ronnie's case, its weight varies in proportion to the strength of that desire, and to how well the action promotes that desire." [98] So Proportionalism involves two different claims. Let's call the thesis expressed in the first conjunct "strength-of-desire Proportionalism" and that in the second "promotion Proportionalism". Previous Humean accounts have maintained that not only does the existence of the right kind of desire of X's for p make it the case that X has a reason to A (where A-ing is some action which promotes p), but also that the weight of that reason co-varies with how much X wants p and how effective A-ing would be at bringing about p. Schroeder rejects this view and his reply to objections to the Humean view crucially hang on his rejecting it. Discussion of this topic dominates the middle three chapters of the book. Let's first see what role rejecting Proportionalism (together with Schroeder's replacement for it) plays in Schroeder's view and then consider the merits of Proportionalism.

Schroeder nicely explains two key objections to the Humean view. There are two ways in which the Humean view systematically seems to get the extension of our reasons wrong, and these generate the Too Many Reasons and Too Few Reasons objections. Perhaps the key historical objection to the Humean view is that it does not make the right sort of room for moral considerations. This is the quickest way to understand the Too Few Reasons objection. The Too Few Reasons objection to the Humean view is motivated by the thought that surely one has a reason to be decent to one's spouse even if one lacks any desire to do so. But the Humean view seems to suggest that people would lack any reason to be decent to each other if they lacked the relevant sorts of desires. Armed with the rejection of Proportionalism and the thesis that I will label "reasons are cheap" Schroeder has a reply to this worry. Let us consider his "reasons are cheap" claim.

To see just how cheap reasons are, according to Schroeder, notice that on his view one has a reason to eat one's car. After all, the car does have some valuable nutrients in it that presumably a normal person would want to ingest. Since one has many desires, and, especially because the things that count as having some tendency to promote the satisfaction of those desires are many, one has a desire-generated reason to do a shockingly broad range of things. Thus, reasons are cheap. Combine with this the rejection of Proportionalism and the result is one's desires play almost no role at all in determining what one should do all things considered. One has a reason to do almost anything and one's desires are not helpful in determining what it makes sense to do when reasons conflict. If reasons are the slaves of the passions, then the passions are masters who offer little or no guidance about what one should do, let alone commands. The traditional Humean component of the view which is shaped by our desires has been rendered harmless and inoffensive.

With that result in hand, it is easy to see why the aspects of the view on the table so far do not commit Schroeder to the counterintuitive extensional claims which motivate Too Few Reasons. For the view so far makes room for the thought that all rational agents have decisive reason to be moral (and indeed this is Schroeder's favored, but not insisted upon, reply to this objection). Hypotheticalism offers the promise of being able to overcome the Too Few Reasons objection by showing how the view makes room for the outcome that all agents have decisive reasons to be moral. After all, one has a Humean reason to do just about anything and the Humean view, freed from Proportionalism, can make room for one's reason to be moral to be quite weighty.

Desires are unruly things. One could have a desire for very odd things, things which intuitively one has no reason to get. For example, it seems possible for a person to have a Humean desire for counting blades of grass, yet intuitively such a person would have no reason to do so. The Too Many Reasons objection is motivated by the thought that the Humean view counterintuitively claims that such desires generate reasons. Armed with the rejection of Proportionalism, there is room for Schroeder to assume that the reasons that are generated for such weird options are very, very small regardless of how much the agent desires that option or how effective the option is at promoting the satisfaction of the desire. Supposing the reason is very tiny, Schroeder offers a plausible story about why it might seem false to say that one has a reason to count blades of grass or to eat one's car. Such claims intuitively sound false, yet are nonetheless true, because there are so many tiny reasons to do so many things that the pragmatics of asserting that there is a reason to do something conversationally imply that the reason is significant or worth considering. And if the reason is tiny it may well be neither. So it is no surprise that our negative existential intuitions about very tiny reasons are unreliable -- our intuitions are attuned to the pragmatic implications of asserting that there is a reason and not to the truth of the claim. Granting Schroeder's premises, this strikes me as a compelling argument.

So, the payoffs for rejecting Proportionalism are potentially attractive, but is Schroeder entitled to do so within a Humean framework? In addressing this issue, I will not be considering Schroeder's alternative story about how to assign weight to reasons. I will instead make a case that aspects of the Humean story that Schroeder accepts commit him to Proportionalism. In the space available here such an argument must necessarily be incomplete and suggestive rather than conclusive. But if such a case could be successfully made it would pre-empt Schroeder's case for an alternative story about the weight of reasons by showing that most of Proportionalism is forced on us once we accept other aspects of Schroeder's view.

Consider first promotion Proportionalism. We will need Schroeder's account of the promotion relation on the table. "X's doing A promotes p just in case it increases the likelihood of p relative to some baseline. And the baseline, I suggest, is fixed by the status quo." [113] His account of promotion is deliberately broad so as to allow for each desire to provide a reason to do a lot of different things. Indeed Schroeder tells us that he thinks previous Humean views failed largely because of their narrow understanding of the promotion relation. [115]

So action A will promote an object of my desire iff A will make it more likely than it already is that I will get it. Thus a desire for p explains a reason to A iff A-ing makes p more likely than it already is. If I have a reason to A, according to Schroeder, then how much weight that reason gets is determined not by the strength of the desire or the strength of the promotion relation. But if I have no reason to A then, even if Schroeder's preferred story about the weight of reasons was standing by ready to multiply greatly the weight of a reason here if there had been one, there will remain no reason to A. And if I have no reason to A and some reason to B then I must have more reason to B than to A since some reason beats no reason every time. [138-40]

What would it be to be committed to promotion Proportionalism? It would be to be committed to the idea that the strength of the reason is proportional to the degree to which the action promotes the object of our desire. Here is why I think Schroeder's view is committed to that. Suppose we have a 50% background likelihood of getting p already. Then an action A which promises only a 49% chance of getting p will explain no reason to take that action, but an action B which promises a 51% chance of p will explain a reason for B-ing. Thus on Schroeder's view we are forced to say that there is more reason to B than to A in this case. Now notice that for any two actions, A and B, which bring about the object of one's desire with different probabilities, we are for the same reason forced to say that when the background likelihood is between the probability associated with A and B, that the strength of the reason to do A and B is again necessarily proportional. So every time A and B promote the object of my desire to a different extent, there will be a set of data points about the weight of reasons to do A and B which is necessarily in accord with promotion Proportionalism. The point is that whenever two options promote the object of a desire to differing degrees, there will necessarily be contexts in which the one that promotes the desire to a greater extent generates a reason and the one that promotes the desire to a lesser extent does not. In that context, Schroeder's view must say that the option which has a higher probability of bringing about the object of our desire generates the stronger reason.

Given this, I think there is only one way for Schroeder to resist promotion Proportionalism. That would be to say that the respective weight of reasons to A and B when the background probability is set at one level does not create consistency pressure on the respective weight of the reasons in favor of those same options when the background probability is set elsewhere. I think such a view deeply counterintuitive. Intuitively, the change in the background probability of the object of one's desire coming about has nothing to do with the relative merits of A versus B. I also think it implausible that we could have more reason to A, which has a 49% chance of bringing about the object of our desire, than B which has a 51% chance, but that A could never generate a reason in the face of a 50% background chance of the desire being satisfied. Finally, it is plainly counterintuitive that in cases in which the only reason I have to A or B is that each is useful in producing p, I could have more reason to A than B even though B is more efficient in producing p.

Now let us turn to strength-of-desire Proportionalism. Consider the difference between what I will call favoring Humean attitudes which generate a "some/none" structure of reasons and favoring attitudes which generate a "more/less" structure of reasons. Desire can naturally be understood as in the former category. If I have a desire for p and a desire for q then, assuming Humeanism, I have a reason for each but the respective weight of those reasons cannot be read simply off of the fact that I have such desires. On the other hand, if I prefer p to q, then the only sensible normative upshot for the Humean to champion based on that attitude is that I have more reason for p than q.

How might we understand desires in the above sense? Well, here are two ways. We might say a person has a desire for p when he prefers p to not-p or p > ~p. Or we might say a person has a desire if he prefers p to a constant neutral point. I'll focus on the former understanding of what it is to have a desire as perhaps it is more plausible. Having a bunch of such desires of the sort p > ~p and q > ~q will generate a bunch of things one has reason to do, but will not automatically speak to the question of the respective weight of the reason for p or q. If I like getting chocolate ice cream more than not getting some then plausibly I have some reason to get some and no reason not to. And similarly, if I like getting vanilla ice cream more than not, plausibly I have some reason to get some. But such some/none favoring attitudes do not generate rankings of the weight of reasons but rather just classify options as either in the 'some reason to do' pile or the 'no reason to do' pile. Desires so understood do not require us to understand the comparative weight of the reasons in any particular way.

On the other hand, more/less attitudes, such as p > q, if they are to have a normative upshot, will have the upshot that we have more reason for p than q. If our primary Humean favoring attitude is a more/less attitude we will not end up merely with a bunch of options all in the 'some reason to do' pile but rather a partial ordering of options which speaks to the strength of the reasons to do the various options. And so it seems that if we start with more/less favoring attitudes as our key psychological notion then the normative upshot must have strength-of-desire Proportionalism built right into it. And so if more/less favoring attitudes are the right ones for Humeans to focus on, then strength-of-desire Proportionalism would be part and parcel of the Humean approach.

For Schroeder's rejection of strength-of-desire Proportionalism to make sense, he needs the primary psychological attitude to have a some/none structure rather than a more/less structure. But desires which plausibly have a some/none upshot would not explain much of what is salient to us and what motivates us. We might prefer not being water boarded to being water boarded and prefer not dying to death. But these desires will not help us explain why avoiding death is more salient to a person than avoiding water boarding and will not help explain a person's motivation to seek the latter if the only other option is the former. They will not explain what is salient or motivating when desires conflict.

This matters for Schroeder's purposes because his analysis of desire is put in terms of what is salient and motivating for a person. [156-7] But then it needs to be explained why we should take as our crucial psychological attitude the option which is less good at explaining salience and motivation (some/none desires) over the attitude which is better at doing so (more/less preferences). One wonders if a key reason to take the notion of some/none desires as primary rather than more/less preferences is merely that they, unlike the latter, offer some hope of being compatible with the rejection of Proportionalism. If our main handle on the key psychological attitude for the Humean is that it explains salience and motivation, then it seems that we should opt for an understanding of this attitude which better captures those aspects of our psychology. And if this is right, we should opt for more/less preferences as our primary Humean psychological attitude. And if we do this, strength-of-desire Proportionalism would be part and parcel of the Humean approach.

A different problem for Schroeder is that he thinks just about every option would promote the object of some desire of ours. But according to his analysis of desires, that which promotes the object of our desires is salient and motivating. But everything cannot be salient and motivating.

Schroeder describes a case where there are three options, Timely, Scenic, and Compromise. [93-94 and 112] Timely dominates the other options in aspects that you care about. Compromise is second best in aspects that you care about and Scenic is the worst option. Schroeder's main point in discussing this case is to argue that there is some reason to choose Compromise despite there being better reasons to choose Timely. He claims that we can see that there are such reasons when we compare Compromise with Scenic. The reason to choose Compromise emerges in that context and provides a decisive reason to choose Compromise in that context.

Schroeder argues that "there is a reason to take Compromise, but simply not as good a reason as there is for you to take Timely." [93] And later he writes, "there is a reason for you to take Compromise. It is not a reason to choose Compromise over Timely. But it is nevertheless a reason to choose Compromise." [112, italics in original] But this conclusion is not sufficient to make room for Schroeder's rejection of strength-of-desire Proportionalism. For if there is no reason at all to choose A over B, and there is some reason to choose B over A, then B must be assigned a weightier status as a reason than A. Such comparisons are of the p > q form and so will have a relative weight of reasons built right into any sensible understanding of the normative upshot of such an attitude.

So long as the comparison is between no reason to do A and some reason to do B, Schroeder's story about the weight of reasons is powerless to affect the relative weight of the reasons between the two. His story about the weight of reasons naturally only kicks in where there is some reason to place weight on. But we can repeatedly arrange the situation such that there is no reason to choose A over B, or B over C. And in cases where Schroeder's weight of reasons story cannot be applied, strength of reasons Proportionalism is assured. And such contexts where the battle is between no reason and some reason will generate enough content to significantly commit us to the strength-of-desire Proportionalism. Further, such rankings seem to place consistency pressure on us to respect such relative weight of reasons in other contexts. And again, if this is so, we are forced to accept Proportionalism.

It might be thought that my argument hinges crucially on the claim that there is no reason at all to choose Compromise rather than Timely in Schroeder's example. And this might be thought to be a problem since Schroeder has provided an argument against relying on negative existential intuitions about reasons. But the cases where I rely on such negative existential intuitions are cases where Schroeder explicitly endorses the view that there is no reason to choose A rather than B. Further, it should be kept in mind that Schroeder's argument to the conclusion that we should not trust our negative existential intuitions about reasons relied on the denial of Proportionalism as a premise. It was only because we presupposed that the weight of reasons was not proportional to the strength-of-desire that we were licensed to claim that the reasons which we intuitively feel are non-existent are in fact existent but tiny. Thus this argument cannot be presupposed in defense of Proportionalism.

I imagine that Schroeder might say that even if there is no reason to choose Compromise over Timely, still there is some reason to choose Compromise and his story about the weight of reasons could get started using that reason and, at least in principle, generate the result that there is more reason to choose Compromise than there is reason to choose Timely. And in this way he could avoid being committed to strength-of-desire Proportionalism. I would resist this for three reasons.

First, it is at odds with his own treatment of promotion Proportionalism. There he said that unless an option promotes the object of one's desire better than the status quo, one has no promotion-based reason at all to choose the option. And this seems right. If one currently has a 50% chance of winning a lottery, one has no reason to change that situation so that one has a 49% chance of winning that lottery because one has no reason, given one's circumstances, to prefer the new option to the status quo. Schroeder might have reasoned as he does in the Timely and Compromise case and said that we still have some reason to take the option which will lower our probability of getting the desired option and we can see that because when we compare that lower probability to some other option with still lower probability, we see that we have more reason to get the former option than the latter and this shows that there is some reason to get the former option even when the former option is competing against an option which dominates it. But he did not say this and seemingly for good reasons. Intuitively there is no reason, not even an outweighed one, to pick an option which lowers the probability of one getting what one wants. And Schroeder's notion of promotion seems well designed to secure just this result. But he wants the opposite result in the strength of reason case, yet the situation seems symmetrical and the intuitions are on the side of how he handles things in the promotion case.

Second, the argument that we have a desire for an option p, and hence have a reason to get that option, whenever there is any alternative option q that we would prefer p to does violence to our notion of desire. This reasoning would suggest that we have a desire for all but the very worst option imaginable, for we would prefer every option to this one.

Third, if there is no reason to choose A over B and some reason to choose B over A, then by Schroeder's own lights we must say the reason to choose B is weightier than the reason to choose A. So any non-proportionalist story that generates the opposite ranking will generate a contradiction in the view. And Schroeder twice acknowledges that there is no reason to choose A over B when A gets one everything one wanted in B and more. This seems to commit him to more of strength-of-desire Proportionalism than he realizes.

Lastly, on a different note, consider a key argument Schroeder offers against strength-of-desire Proportionalism and which is also supposed to help motivate his own view about how to assign weight to reasons. He tells us that how much weight to place on a reason is a normative matter and so we must look not to how much weight people actually place on the reason but rather to what weight it would be correct for them to place on the reason. [129] But when Schroeder was searching for an answer to the normative question of whether there is a normative reason to do something he was content to rely not on whether it was correct to have a desire for that thing but whether one did in fact have a desire for that thing. This asymmetry is difficult to understand.


Humeans tend to assume that there is some rationale for the view which can stand up to the most obvious counter-intuitive consequences of the view. Schroeder's Humean view is built so as to conflict much less with our intuitions than previous versions of the view. As Schroeder tells us in the introduction, his Humean view was constructed so as to avoid arguments that he found telling and one such argument was that the view as previously formulated gets the wrong answer about the status of moral reasons [v]. While many will rejoice at Schroeder's arguments that there is potential for combining the clarity of the Humean program with the commonsensical view that there are strong reasons for all agents to obey morality, others will wonder if the champions of the Humean view have lost faith that there is a rationale for the program sufficient to challenge common sense.[1]

[1] Much thanks to Janice Dowell, Errol Lord and Mark Schroeder, an audience at the University of Amsterdam, and a reading group at the University of Leiden for help in thinking about these issues.