Social Philosophy after Adorno

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Lambert Zuidervaart, Social Philosophy after Adorno, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 219pp., $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521690386.

Reviewed by Hauke Brunkhorst, Universität Flensburg


Zuidervaart claims "solidarity with Adorno's negative dialectic in the moment of its collapse" (p. 76) -- a paraphrase of Adorno's own claim at the end of his Negative Dialectics(1966) where he promised solidarity with metaphysics in the moment of its collapse (Solidarität mit der Metaphysik im Augenblick ihres Sturzes).[1] Adorno's criticism of modern society, the author assumes, is not radical enough. Adorno tries to outbid all other philosophers and social critics with his negative radicalism, but his great negativist gesture of outbidding all radical social criticism is pseudo-radical. Adorno's Negative Dialectics leaves us with the sad alternative: "All or Nothing" (p. 72f), but this alternative itself leaves us nothing to do to change the world because everything less than all is wrong. Adorno's apparently most radical construction of the modern world as a totally closed universe of negativity is deeply inconsistent. If the world is ruled by his famous two laws: (1) "The whole is the false" (Das Ganze ist das Unwahre), and (2) "There is no good life in a bad society" (Es gibt kein richtiges Leben im falschen),[2] then even a first step to get all (or at least a bit of all) is impossible because in a negative universe all steps are, a priori, steps in the wrong direction. Hence, we can hope to be saved at once, and to get it all, only if this is granted by the grace of a power higher than us. Hence, we need a light on the fallen world that derives not from human enlightenment but from the messianic point of redemption.[3] From such a negative theological perspective, anything that is in the reach of our achievements is nothing else than a catastrophe.[4] Whatever we do, we do it wrong. For Adorno, the only praxis that is not a reproduction and prolongation of the bad society is thinking, and this seems problematic because it is only the praxis of a privileged philosopher. As a single individual, the critical intellectual can reflect his non-identity with the system (see below). Therefore, the negative dialectic of "all or nothing" in the end leads to nothing, and becomes, contrary to Adorno's intention, an ideological affirmation of the already existing world, or as Adorno usually says, the existing (das Bestehende).[5]

Taken this way, Adorno's critique of modern society is not too radical but not radical enough (p. 72f). Yet, the richness of Adorno's criticism of modern society comes only to the fore after its collapse, after its determined negation and deconstruction. One could say with Rorty that Adorno needs a radical reinterpretation, and the Zuidervaart's book impressively shows how such (already overdue) reinterpretation can work. Zuidervaart suggests for example that we should take Adorno's sentence that the whole is the false not as a mere cognitive statement and a simple tit-for-tat answer to Hegel, but as one of many world-disclosing perspectives that carries a useful practical truth with it. This truth becomes manifest only in specific situations.

It takes (for example) only one look at the breathtaking emergence of the neo-liberal epistemic paradigm to reveal that the truth of the whole which this paradigm promises is the false. The neo-liberal epistemic paradigm today shapes the minds and options of nearly all global actors, individuals, organizations and states, and apparently nobody, whether they want it or not, can any longer avoid taking part in the neo-liberal global project. Global free markets appear as the best of all possible worlds. Their promise is that the whole is the truth because, if we follow the rules of the markets, the global market is a win-win game, and in the long run everybody will be much better off. Yet, this is an empty promise: sooner or later there will be blood, and in the long run we are all dead; hence, the whole (of the global market story) is the false:

What Adorno articulates more eloquently than his successors is that 'the whole is the false'. In the long run, we cannot resist the repression of desire and the destruction of nature unless we dismantle economic exploitation. What he needed to say more vigorously, however, and with greater nuance, is that the whole is not wholly false. This is the valid point to Habermas's otherwise overwrought critique. (p. 131)

From a European perspective, and in particular from the universalizable perspective of our knowledge about Auschwitz, history is a single catastrophe, and the whole is the false. But there is not only the European perspective on the 20th Century (like that of Benjamin or Adorno), and from a social democratic American perspective (like that of Dewey or Rorty) the 20th Century looks different. For Americans the 20th Century was that of the greatest progress ever seen in history, and not only in technical terms but also in legal and political terms: (national) social progress, moderate and radical democracy, human rights, global civil society, and global human rights culture. Zuidervaart at the end of his book refers strongly to these more hopeful perspectives (Chapters 5 and 6). The point here is that both perspectives, that of Adorno and that of Dewey, seem to be generalizable: The whole is the false and the whole is the truth. Astonishingly enough, Adorno himself has found a phrase that covers both perspectives of the age of extremes (Hobsbawn)[6]: Dialectic without mediation (Dialektik ohne Mitte).[7]

Zuidervaart begins his book with a very personal preface which reveals immediately one of the central motives for reading and rereading Adorno: as a radical critic of modern society, and as one who even in a society without hope hopefully tries to keep the promise of a better world alive, Adorno is the thinker of the non-identical (das Nichtidentische) and the suffering of the individual under the rule of (false) universality.[8] The author connects this general motive with the contingent bad fortune of his own family, which was confronted at the time that he wrote the book with the brute fact of serious illness and the permanent threat of suffering and death. From Adorno's philosophical perspective, it is just such contingent destiny that makes philosophy necessary, even after its end.[9] Adorno's answer to the question: "Why Philosophy?" (Wozu noch Philosophie?)[10], is in this respect completely in accord with that part of the metaphysical tradition that is left when metaphysics, in the moment of its collapse, loses its ideological power of transfiguration. We need philosophy because there is guilt and suffering, torture and death, and there is also the hope for salvation. Zuidervaart's very personal preface brings the reader close to the very core of Adorno's negative thinking, because the only aim of this thinking was to do justice to the single individual, and to withstand its pitiless subsumption under the universalism of natural and moral laws. Hence truth and individual suffering appear to be internally connected:

Traditional metaphysics informed by Hebraic wisdom literature asked why good people suffer. Adorno asks why, in a society that has the means to eliminate poverty, hunger, and economic exploitation, suffering continues unabated, and even takes the forms of genocide and mass destruction. If this is a metaphysical question, then it is also a central question of social critique. To avoid it would be to give up philosophy's pursuit of truth and to seal its political irrelevance. (p. 61)

The book's introduction (Thinking Otherwise) outlines Zuidervaart's aim: to defend the metaphysical claims of traditional European philosophy, which connects philosophical experience and reason with real life problems of suffering, salvation, and hope (p. 4). Throughout the book, Zuidervaart argues that postmetaphysical thinking (including Habermas's harsh criticism of claims that transcend the reach of our theoretical and practical deliberation and knowledge) wrongly try to get (more or less) rid of these distinctively philosophical problems. Like Adorno, Zuidervaart does not want to defend the metaphysical solutions of traditional European thinking. But he maintains that we still should take seriously the substantial philosophical claims for an unrestricted experience serious, an experience that particularly includes suffering, salvation, and hope. For this purpose the author presumes that we need a retrieval of Adorno's philosophically inspired critique of society as a whole. This retrieval should not, however, maintain Adorno's totalizing negativism. But neither should it follow Habermas in replacing critique of totality with a more specific critique of social pathologies, undemocratic domination and oppression, and universal social and political injustice -- without touching the existing modern constitutional and institutional framework that enables such criticism.

Instead of criticising society as a negative whole, Habermas uses its still institutionalized post-conventional relations of understanding as a quasi-transcendental starting point for a self-criticism of modern society from within.[11] According to Zuidervaart, such a Habermasian criticism is not wrong and not at all -- as some orthodox Adornians suggest -- a simple duplication and prolongation of "the existing". But he thinks that there is more than Habermas would admit that is useful and justifiable in Adorno's notions of a critique of the whole, of an unrestricted experience, and of authentic truth. On his view, any attempt for a critical retrieval (pp. 10-15) of Adorno's work has to go after Adorno (pp. 7-10) in three respects: (1) "to carry forward crucial insights of Adorno's social philosophy" by (2) "'going after' Adorno's successors such as Habermas" but (3) "acknowledging legitimate Habermasian criticism of Adorno" which one "needs … to suggest viable alternatives" (p. 7).

In Chapters 3, 4, 5 and 6 the author tries to outline this project of a critical social philosophy after Adorno. In the chapters (2 and 3) which immediately follow the introduction Zuidervaart argues that Adorno's theory of aesthetic subjectivity should not be reduced to (tragic or merely irritating) transgressions – as, for example, in the deconstructionist reading by Christoph Menke -- but must be understood as well and primarily as part of a broader attempt of critical transformation of national late- or post-national turbo-capitalism. Distinguishing the necessary paradoxes of aesthetic sovereignty from the not necessarily paradoxical dialectical contradictions of the societal autonomy of arts (p. 19), Zuidervaart expresses his solidarity with Adorno's view in the moment of its collapse when he defends the social critical and utopian dimensions of art (pp. 27, 29, 37, 42, 45, 47). He tries to give more concrete examples than Adorno did of the social and even utopian dimensions of art in our everyday life (pp. 47, 148. 153). In a similar way he defends Adorno's more metaphysical claims and speculative moments (p. 63) against Wellmer's strictly postmetaphysical criticism. Again not denying the right of Menke's deconstructionist and Wellmer's postmetaphysical readings of Adorno, Zuidervaart tries to use these readings and that of Habermas for his own purposes to replace Adorno's wrong idea of a "totalized transformation" of society (pp. 72-74) by the idea of a "differential transformation" (pp. 126-131).

Chapter 3 reconstructs unrestricted experience with the (post- Adornian) purpose of developing a normative theory of democratic truth "that goes beyond Habermas's political philosophy" (p. 9). This is an important point also because the project comes much closer to Habermas than Zuidervaart assumes. Habermas himself strongly defends the thesis that a "post-truth-democracy could be no longer democratic".[12] Unfortunately Zuidervaart does not discuss this phrase and the Habermasian idea of a reversal of democratic truth.

The author reconstructs and deconstructs first Heidegger's idea of unrestricted experience—what--Heidegger calls authenticity (Eigentlichkeit).[13] Going back to Adorno (and Tugendhat), Zuidervaart criticizes Heidegger's ontological reification of alienation (pp. 87-90), of false immediateness (pp. 91-94), and of the "lack of interdependence and intersubjectivity" (p. 94). Here, unfortunately, Adorno can only partially compensate Heidegger's deficits with his own notions of emphatic experience and authentic truth (pp. 95-106). Even if Adorno successfully reintroduces historical mediation and societal interdependence, he fails completely with the intersubjective dimension. Adorno's idea of privileged philosophical experience is as elitist as that of Heidegger (pp. 97-100).

One could summarize or reconstruct Zuidervaart's deliberation on Heidegger and Adorno in the following way: Whereas Heidegger and Adorno are right to insist that intersubjective or public communication does not think (as an thinker can), they are deeply wrong in ignoring the fact that all argumentation and justification needs communication and that thinking cannot make any argument with a substantial and justifiable claim to truth because it can only reflect and draw logical conclusions from itself. Adorno paradoxically restricts unrestricted experience and authentic truth to (privileged) thinking; as a result he lacks any idea of democratic truth.

In his own deliberations on the content of democratic truth, Zuidervaart comes close to the Habermasian position (pp. 102, 104). Against Adorno and Heidegger he assumes that any "authentication of truth" must be "public" (p. 101). Even if both Heidegger and Adorno "question" with some right the (euro-centric) "linkage" between public authenticitation and the rationality of discursive practices, they do so "at the expense of authenticitation's public character" (p. 105), and Zuidervaart adds:

Truth as such may not be democratic, but its invitational enactment must be public. A public invitation will be open to free recognition and acceptance or refusal on the part of those invited. To that extent, and to the extent that public freedom, recognition, and participation are the hallmarks of democracy, the authenticitation of truth must be not only public but democratic. Truth calls for public authenticitation. It calls for democratic truth telling … that does not avoid public presentation and response. (p. 105)

Against Habermas, Rorty, Wellmer and others, Zuidervaart claims a stronger criticism of "Western philosophy's logical prejudices", and argues for a less formal notion of truth that includes a variety of other life-giving disclosures, not only linguistic world disclosure (pp. 103, 105). Yet, I suspect that there is not a big difference—if any at all--between Zuidervaart's and Habermas's theories of democratic truth.

Chapters 4 and 5 provide a careful rereading of Adorno and Horkheimer's Dialectic of Enlightenment and of Adorno's idea of individual autonomy that withstands the pressure of the system of cultural industry. Zuidervaart first shows convincingly that the potential of the Dialectic of Enlightenment (1944) to reflect the new problems of global capitalism and the global 'repression' of our natural environment is not yet exhausted, as people like Habermas seem to presuppose a bit too quickly. Zuidervaart makes the rich variety of implicit differentiations of the concept of rationality in Adorno's theory explicit, and tries to use it for a determinate negation of the systemic rationality of global capitalism, domination and exploitation. The reinterpretation of Adorno's idea of "remembrance of nature" leads to an emphasis on the unfinished meaning of our ideas of social emancipation, democratic self-determination, and a reconciliation of society and nature. In the following chapter (5) these deliberations are concretized in an attempt to reconsider feminism in the light of Adorno's theory of autonomy and cultural industry, and conversely to reconsider Adorno's theory in the light of the global feminist and multicultural discourse.

Chapter 6, following Brunkhorst and others, outlines the project of global social criticism that still follows Adorno's utopian spirit and tries to reinterpret the not yet exhausted meaning of his negative and critical categories but no longer uses Adorno's language and conceptual framework. Instead of that, Zuidervaart invents a more strongly normative and much more interdisciplinary vocabulary. In this way, Adornian criticism of modern society should be continued. This is a great book which discloses new perspectives in reading and transforms Adorno.

[1] Adorno, Negative Dialektik, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 398.

[2] Adorno, Minima Moralia. Reflexionen aus dem beschädigten Leben, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp 1969.

[3] Adorno, Minima Moralia.

[4] Walter Benjamin, Geschichtsphilosophische Thesen. Zur Kritik der Gewalt und andere Aufsätze, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp 1978.

[5] Theodor W. Adorno, Negative Dialektik.

[6] Eric Hobsbawn, Age of Extremes. The Short Twentieth Century 1914-1991, London: Michael Joseph 1994.

[7] Adorno, Drei Studien zu Hegel, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp 1969.

[8] Adorno, Negative Dialektik.

[9] Adorno, Negative Dialektik, 13-40.

[10] Adorno, Wozu noch Philosophie?, in: Gesammelte Schriften 10.2, Frankfurt: Suhrkamp 1977, 459-473.

[11] On Habermas and quasi-transcendentalism see: Jürgen Habermas, Theorie des kommunikativen Handelns, 2 Vol., Frankfurt: Suhrkamp 1992.

[12] My translation. The German original goes: A "'post-truth-democracy' … wäre keine Demokratie mehr." Habermas, "Religion in der Öffentlichkeit," in: Naturalismus, 119-154, quote from page 150f.

[13] Martin Heidegger, Sein und Zeit, Tübingen: Niemeyer 1977.