Socrates on Friendship and Community: Reflections on Plato's Symposium, Phaedrus, and Lysis

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Mary P. Nichols, Socrates on Friendship and Community: Reflections on Plato's Symposium, Phaedrus, and Lysis, Cambridge UP, 2009, 230pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521899734.

Reviewed by Tushar Irani, Wesleyan University



Socrates on Friendship and Community is a work filled with sensitive analysis and reflection, both in its careful reading of the dialogues on which it focuses and in its comparison of Plato with two thinkers from the modern period, Kierkegaard and Nietzsche, who Nichols claims had very different views on the value of friendship and community, and as a consequence very different views on the human good. The book explores the role of friendship in Socrates’ conception of philosophy through a study of three of Plato’s most well-known and treasured dialogues — the Symposium, Phaedrus, and Lysis — and draws from these works the insight that “through friendship we experience both our own as not wholly our own and another as not wholly other” (p. 1). This is the experience that characterizes the highest form of love for Plato, and to the extent that the philosopher is also a kind of lover (i.e., of wisdom or truth), it is also the experience that characterizes philosophy. (Since philosophers, as we all know, pursue only the highest forms of love.) Nichols finds this model of friendship embedded in Socrates’ practice of engaging others in discussion, and uncovering it is the main interpretive project she sets herself in the book.

In addition to this interpretive project, no small undertaking in itself, Nichols adds a comparative task to her agenda in pitting her view of Socrates as a proponent of friendship against two rather different views advanced by Kierkegaard and Nietzsche, for whom Socrates is an otherworldly figure, alienated from human society. Though Kierkegaard and Nietzsche criticize Socrates, Nichols contends, they nonetheless retain in their views of the good life a turn away from community towards subjectivity that she finds characteristic of modern Western thought. The book thus has two general aims. First, in recovering the place of friendship and community in Socratic practice, Nichols presents Plato’s approach to philosophy as a corrective to the more alienating features of modernity. Second, Nichols considers her study a contribution to the scholarly literature on friendship in antiquity, which all too often dwells on the views of Aristotle rather than Plato. Commentators who disregard the value of friendship in Plato neglect a significant — indeed essential — aspect of his political philosophy, according to Nichols, and in so doing overlook its enduring relevance to contemporary issues surrounding the human good.

In these two general aims, the book succeeds splendidly. Whereas Socrates and Plato include a central role for love and friendship in their reflections on the human good, one cannot help but feel by the end of Nichols’ work that in their own portraits of the good life, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and their modernist peers have bequeathed us a legion of chronic brooders.1 It is, moreover, refreshing to find a scholar approach Plato’s political philosophy from the perspective of his views on friendship and through the study of dialogues that are rarely considered in discussions of his political thought. Although, as I will suggest below, some of the more specific claims Nichols makes in this study could do with further elaboration and support, her book as a whole provides a novel contribution to our understanding of Plato and rewards close reading.

Before summarizing and evaluating the contents of the book, however, some preliminary remarks are in order concerning its organization. While it contains five chapters, the work itself does not reveal a clearly continuous argument. In part, this is because of the twofold nature of Nichols’ project. Chapter 1 begins with Kierkegaard’s and Nietzsche’s accounts of Socrates, but ends with many questions left hanging. In developing their accounts, Nichols seeks to show that Plato’s Socrates anticipates aspects of Kierkegaard’s and Nietzsche’s criticisms yet the details of this more inclusive portrayal are not really spelled out until Chapter 5. By far the bulk of the book lies in Chapters 2-4, which form its interpretive core. This is where Nichols develops her account of Plato’s views on love and friendship, and where she argues specifically for the idea that love must be transformed into friendship to fulfill its promise. These three chapters provide detailed critical interpretations of the Symposium, Phaedrus, and Lysis, though readers hoping for further discussion of Kierkegaard and Nietzsche will find them cited only in passing, and the connections between the themes on which Nichols dwells in this interpretive core of the work and her comparative project will not be readily apparent. Nevertheless, almost all loose ends are tied up by the final chapter, and those more interested in one or the other of Nichols’ projects may safely focus on relevant portions of the book without loss of comprehension.

Nichols begins her study in Chapter 1 by using Kierkegaard’s and Nietzsche’s accounts of Socrates as a springboard for her own interpretation. For Kierkegaard, Socrates is an alienating figure because of his single-minded pursuit of knowledge and his method of philosophical doubt. This confidence in reason must be tempered by an acceptance of human incompleteness — a kind of piety that recognizes our distance from absolute truth (or the divine) and thus requires faith. Nichols finds herself agreeing with Kierkegaard here on the need for piety in Socrates’ pursuit of wisdom, although she doesn’t believe this is absent from his conception of philosophy, nor that it must tend in the direction of alienation. For Nietzsche, on the other hand, Socrates remains an alienating figure because of his persistent denial of human instincts and hostility to life. Here we see a demand for a poetic and life-affirming Socrates, no longer bound by the constraints of rationalism, seeking solace instead in the “infinity of art”, as Nietzsche puts it in The Birth of Tragedy. Again, Nichols finds much to agree with in the need for a poetic Socrates, but she suggests that Plato’s portrayal of his teacher in fact accommodates this demand and that the poetry of Socratic practice can be discerned in the role that friendship plays in his life, particularly in his engagement with others in philosophical discussion.

This is not the place to challenge the details of Nichols’ readings of Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. The views she attributes to them are painted in broad brush strokes and her first chapter proceeds rather swiftly, but the upshot is clear enough. Despite the faults she sees in Kierkegaard’s and Nietzsche’s accounts of Socrates, there are genuine insights she wishes to preserve in the respective positions that they assign to piety and poetry in human life. But how should Socratic practice be understood as pious? And how poetic? Nichols would have done well at this point in the book to outline her answers to these questions, since her analysis of Plato’s views on love and friendship in Chapters 2-4 does little to explain how Socrates can be considered a pious or poetic figure, and readers must wait until the end to judge whether Plato’s account meets Kierkegaard’s and Nietzsche’s criticisms. (See summary of Chapter 5 below.) Some clarification of key terms would have also been helpful. Nichols’ conception of piety in particular turns out to be admirably more down to earth than traditional understandings, but perhaps idiosyncratic. Famously, the Greek virtue often translated “piety” (to hosion) is the central theme of the Euthyphro, yet Nichols refers to this dialogue very rarely and in an unrelated connection in later chapters, where she renders the term “the holy” (e.g., p. 109), suggesting she has a quite different concept in mind.

Some scholars may question whether Kierkegaard’s and Nietzsche’s accounts of Socrates merit consideration in understanding Plato’s own thought. For those prone to balk at such comparisons, one observation seems worth registering on the ideas developed in this book, since they touch on larger issues in Platonic studies. Nichols regards the prevalence of poetry and myth in the dialogues and the place of piety in Socratic practice as an acknowledgment on Plato’s part of the shortcomings of reason. She claims, for instance, that “Plato calls our attention to the limits of Socrates’ arguments through the action of the dialogue”, that “The arguments that come from Plato come only embedded in stories”, and that her analysis of the Symposium and Phaedrus explores “Socrates’ awareness of the limits of reason, and the place of poetry and piety in human life” (pp. 22-24). These comments reveal the main interpretive strategy she employs in her book, but they also help explain the themes she focuses on in Plato. According to Nichols, the dramatic aspects of the dialogues are as important as Socrates’ arguments in understanding Plato’s intentions in writing; when these arguments come to naught, as they often do, we should consider whether the more literary features of his works can fill in the gaps. These may include details of character or setting, historical information, and intertextual allusions, all of which are discussed perceptively in her reading of the dialogues.

Few Plato scholars nowadays will object to this general interpretive line. Yet Nichols goes further than warranted in often suggesting that there lies additional meaning in the literary details that Plato relates, even when we can be certain of the arguments that Socrates makes. In a short early discussion of the Phaedo, for example, she finds evidence of the limits of Socrates’ logic in the hymn to Apollo he admits to composing at the beginning of the dialogue, which on her reading is "actually the key to the Phaedo as a whole", since when confronted with the fears and terrors of human existence Socrates here ultimately consults “an Apollonian vision in order to deal with them” (p. 20). That Socrates in his final hours turns to poetry is certainly fascinating and worth considering for a complete grasp of this elaborate work, but it does scant justice to the rigors of Plato’s philosophy to discount the finely wrought arguments that he develops for the immortality of the soul and to doubt Socrates’ confidence in these arguments as he awaits his death. This is not to take issue with Plato’s status as a dramatist of the highest order, nor with Nichols’ general interpretive line. We can keep the poetry along with the philosophy. The dramatic action of the dialogues can inform, help situate, or bring Socrates’ arguments into sharper relief, and in this way assume an important but still ancillary role in our understanding of Plato’s thought, rather than serve as the main guide to his intentions.

I turn now to Chapters 2-4: the interpretive core of Nichols’ study. The Symposium, Phaedrus, and Lysis are three of Plato’s most literary works and are a natural focus for her, given her approach to reading the dialogues, but she also argues in this portion of the book for the continuing significance of Socrates’ conception of philosophy today. She finds this conception “captured in his understanding of friendship and political community, how the latter is a reflection of the former, and how both are fundamental to a good human life” (p. 24). The ideas developed in these chapters are the most thought-provoking in the book and will attract the attention of political philosophers interested in how a civic life based on ancient ideals of love and friendship can nonetheless preserve a place for the individualism central to modern thought and politics, as Nichols claims. The chapters themselves proceed programmatically — each focuses on a specific dialogue following the order in which Socrates’ would have appeared in them during his life — and may be assigned individually in an upper-level undergraduate course or graduate seminar devoted to studying these works.

Chapter 2 begins by observing that the Symposium is the only dialogue in which Socrates vies with two of the most eminent poets of his time — Aristophanes and Agathon. The dialogue is also notable for ending with a fiery screed against Socrates by Alcibiades, one of the leading political figures in Athens of the late fifth century. Dramatically, the work is set within a year of the ill-fated Sicilian expedition championed by Alcibiades in 415 BCE, which would prompt Athens’ eventual defeat in its war against Sparta. Given that the case for the corrupting influence of philosophy on the life of the city was made on behalf of the poets and political men of Athens at Socrates’ trial in 399, Nichols finds in the Symposium a reconsideration of those charges against Socrates and a personal “apology” by Plato in defense of his teacher that argues for “the mutual dependence of Socratic philosophizing and political life” (p. 30; cf. p. 25). This dependence is explained by Socrates’ understanding of love, which is mediated in the dialogue through what he has learned from the foreign prophetess Diotima, and which emphasizes both human need and resourcefulness. Socrates’ speech is thus a direct response to the speeches of Aristophanes and Agathon, particularly their inability to recognize the potential of a love generated by those “pregnant in soul”, to use Diotima’s marvelous phrase. The range of objects generated and nurtured by such lovers include not only children, but works of art and poetry, the laws of political communities, pieces of knowledge, philosophical arguments, and virtue itself in the character of others (Symposium, 208e-212a). Hence, Nichols contends, “the state between poverty and resource that accounts for the pursuit of wisdom and its generation in others through questioning them also accounts for the ongoing human activities that keep political communities alive and flourishing” (p. 69).

Insofar as its account of love goes, however, Nichols maintains that the argument of the Symposium is incomplete. This is because Socrates’ speech has little to say about reciprocated love or friendship; we hear only about the perspective of the lover, but nothing about a beloved who loves in return. For that we must turn to Chapter 3 of Nichols’ study and the Phaedrus, which is where she believes “Socrates gives an account of how the beloved becomes a lover, loves in return, and how both [lover and beloved] see themselves in the other” (p. 87). This dialogue thus goes a step further than the Symposium in linking love with self-knowledge and friendship. The Phaedrus also includes a famous paean to love in which Socrates defines love as a kind of madness — a fact that commentators such as Gregory Vlastos have found “extraordinary” for an “ultrarationalist” such as Plato.2 Against this view, Nichols sees in Socrates’ praise of madness added confirmation of Plato’s awareness of the limits of reason, and draws the conclusion that the self-knowledge achieved through friendship may not ultimately be the sort that is susceptible to rationalization (pp. 118-19).

Chapter 4 develops the difference between love and friendship further by focusing on the Lysis, the final dialogue in Nichols’ erotic triumvirate. In arguing for this development in the dialogues, she takes the unorthodox and, to the best of my knowledge, almost unique view that the Lysis contains Plato’s most mature thoughts on love.3 For the Phaedrus tells us little about how love becomes friendship or what the difference is between the two, while the guiding question of the Lysis is “what is a friend?” (p. 150). Nichols considers each of the accounts Socrates explores in answering this question, and although the dialogue ends in aporia, she views an idea floated early on in the discussion — “that friends are those who love and are loved” — to be the key insight of the work (p. 169). This may surprise some readers of the Lysis, since Socrates goes on to argue against friendship being necessarily reciprocal in the dialogue, yet Nichols holds that “Socrates does not conclude that our friend need not love in return to be a friend … Rather, he states that he is ‘at a loss’ as to ‘who become friends to each other’, and that he and Menexenus may be seeking in an altogether wrong way” (p. 170).

I’ll return to the possibility of unreciprocated friendship in Plato towards the end of this review, but Nichols herself is clear on the issue: “Unlike love, friendship is reciprocal… . One cannot become a friend unless another does so as well” (p. 180). She finds the argument that Socrates gives later in the Lysis that “our friends are phantom friends in light of the first friend in which all friends terminate” - a highly mysterious object considered by some commentators to be knowledge, happiness, or perhaps the form of beauty reappearing from the Symposium - “not the dialogue’s deepest teaching about friendship” (p. 180). Further, she claims that the Lysis ends indecisively on the topic of friendship “because Socrates refuses to abandon friendship as a reciprocal human relationship, rooted in need” (p. 187). She therefore concludes this interpretive portion of the book by connecting Plato’s (now developed) views on friendship with her earlier defense of Socratic philosophy. Philosophy maintains itself in the political sphere by taking friendship as its model, which is to say there should be no radical divide between the philosopher and others, but reciprocal relations of fellow feeling. Although he was deemed a threat to the city, Socrates’ practice of engaging other Athenians in discussion was actually an attempt on his part to foster a bond with his political community (pp. 190-2).

Having made a case for the importance of philosophy to political life, Nichols circles back to her comparative project in Chapter 5. Earlier in Chapter 1 she had left unexplained how Plato’s Socrates might be considered a pious or poetic figure, and so meet the challenges posed by Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. The view of the role of piety and poetry in Socratic practice that she develops in this final chapter involves, as I understand it, fundamentally reconceiving the relationship between human and divine. Climacus, the pseudonymous author of Kierkegaard’s Philosophical Fragments, collapses the distance between human ignorance and divine truth, and thereby obviates the need for philosophy and faith. The pursuit of knowledge thus becomes unnecessary: why ask questions when the truth already lies within us? In contrast, Nietzsche denies any link at all between human and divine, which prevents the possibility of acquiring knowledge altogether according to Nichols. Instead of the discovery of truth, what we have on this view are manufactured or constructed truths: “Philosophers might suppose they have discovered the truth when they would have discovered only themselves and their own creations” (p. 213). So while for Kierkegaard philosophy and faith are unnecessary, the result for Nietzsche is that philosophy and faith are impossible.

These are ambitious themes for a concluding chapter, although it must be said that Nichols’ readings of Kierkegaard and Nietzsche are not worked out with as much care as her earlier readings of the dialogues. She does not, for instance, acknowledge that for a number of contemporary philosophers, as well as some of Nietzsche’s recent interpreters, the practice of philosophy is quite compatible with anti-realist approaches to truth, and on the question of faith, his gripe was against certain strains of religious faith. I imagine that philosophers with faith in themselves and their own creations would be roundly applauded by Nietzsche.

More generally, one gets the sense that Nichols’ readings of Kierkegaard and Nietzsche really only serve as foils for the portrait of Socrates she wants to get across in her book. Three components make up this portrait: piety, poetry, and friendship. With the role of friendship in Socratic philosophy established in earlier chapters, she now argues that “both Socrates’ piety and his appreciation of poetry turn on his view of friendship as essential to his philosophic life” (p. 208). How, then, is Socratic practice pious? It’s pious for Nichols in recognizing a distance between oneself and another, which is half of what’s involved in a reciprocal loving relationship or friendship. The way in which such piety figures in philosophy, I take it, is through recognition of an analogous distance between oneself and the truth, which explains why “friends capture for us that wonder that moves philosophers, who experience their own as other and the other as their own” (p. 211). This is Plato’s response to Kierkegaard.

What about his response to Nietzsche? How might Socratic practice be understood as poetic? It’s poetic in recognizing a link between oneself and another, which is the other half of what Nichols finds involved in friendship. If I understand her correctly, the role of such poetry in philosophy consists in keeping Socratic argument alive in dialogue with others, since the dialectical art “is not self-sufficient, but must direct itself to a fitting soul, in which it plants seeds that come to fruition and from which spring others in other souls” (p. 212). The image is a famous one from Plato’s Phaedrus, and points to the fecundity of philosophical inquiry. Philosophy, modeled on the experience of friendship, provides us here with the opportunity to connect with others in civil society with whom we can share and sustain a common bond while preserving our individuality.

Needless to say, the claims advanced in this final chapter are developed with great originality. Nichols goes to impressive lengths to connect her concluding themes with the view of friendship derived from her earlier interpretation of Plato. Her comparative project would probably have been better served, however, if her focus had remained on showing how Plato’s emphasis on the value of friendship provides an alternative to the alienating depictions of human flourishing that she finds in modern philosophy. I mentioned this as one of her chief aims at the beginning of this review, and I should reiterate that it is one of the highlights of the book. Whereas Kierkegaard’s and Nietzsche’s visions of the human good go awry in counseling a life of spiritual and philosophical retreat, she argues, Socrates’ search for a life of philosophical friendship and community reflects a richer awareness of the needs of human beings and our dependence on others for our happiness. This will no doubt surprise scholars accustomed to thinking of Plato’s philosopher as a world-weary participant in civic life, yet Nichols is right to call attention to the centrality of community to his political thought and to compare the implications of his view with Kierkegaard’s and Nietzsche’s positions. In the portraits that they offer of the good life, there is a profound difference between Socrates wrangling with his fellow Athenians in the agora and Nietzsche’s Zarathustra, wandering lonely as a cloud over mountain ridge and peak.

If there is a problem with Nichols’ interpretation of Plato, it lies in the details of the account of friendship she attributes to him. There are, as I see it, two main difficulties with this account. The first concerns her idea that Plato’s conception of love undergoes significant development. Nichols relies too heavily here on the dramatic ordering of the dialogues in claiming that the Lysis "indicates a more developed and more positive vision than either the Symposium or the Phaedrus" (p. 155n. 9). The Lysis is a complex and superbly crafted work, but where the Symposium and Phaedrus offer us positive accounts of love, the Lysis ends inconclusively, so it is not altogether clear how the first two works lead to the third, as she maintains.4 Moreover, in assuming a developmental reading of the dialogues, Nichols overlooks the possibility of a unitarian reading; before we suppose that an author’s views undergo considerable alteration over time, it seems to me we should presume more unity rather than disunity in his or her thought. Nichols finds the arguments of the Symposium and Phaedrus lacking in comparison with the Lysis because of their silence on the topic of friendship, but this takes for granted that there exists a difference between true love and friendship for Plato. Perhaps at the highest level of Diotima’s ladder the two are indistinguishable.5

The deeper difficulty with Nichols’ reading of Plato, however, is that she believes that reciprocity is essential to his account of friendship. This is why she considers his account of love deficient, of course, since love need not be reciprocated. Nevertheless there is little to suggest that friendship must be a reciprocal relationship for Plato, and much that tells against this reading. The Greek term philia most often translated “friendship” in English generally connotes some fondness for a person or thing, without conveying any implication that the affection be mutual. More abstractly, the Presocratic philosopher Empedocles understood the concept as a universal principle of attraction that bound the cosmos together during cycles of generation and destruction — a view that Plato reveals his familiarity with in a number of dialogues (cf. Sophist, 242d-243a).

There is, then, nothing in the Greek and in the philosophical tradition before Plato to indicate that he considered friendship a necessarily reciprocal relationship. Nichols’ claim that “One cannot become a friend unless another does so as well” is particularly hard to reconcile with the Lysis (p. 180). Beginning at 212a in the dialogue, Socrates shrewdly exploits the fact that philia covers a wider range of associations than those his audience initially regards as friendships, and when he entertains the idea that philia involves reciprocal loving at 212c-e he dismisses it summarily. If reciprocal loving were necessary for friendship, he claims, it would be impossible to love a variety of objects traditionally viewed as “friends” or phila: horse-lovers, wine-lovers, and exercise-lovers — not to mention wisdom-lovers (philosophoi) — would be ruled out on principle. Yet these forms of human attachment are possible, as well as relations with others incapable of loving in return, such as a newborn baby.6 So, we are led to infer, reciprocal loving cannot be necessary for friendship. As far as I can tell, Nichols does not show how her conception of reciprocity avoids the problems that this passage poses for cases of friendship in which reciprocity is precluded due to the nature of the object. At any rate, it is a special problem for her reading of Plato that the practice of philosophy is rendered impossible when she locates similar worries in the views of Kierkegaard and Nietzsche.

It seems that love must be reciprocated and transformed into friendship for Nichols because in a reciprocal relationship partners both belong to one another and remain independent: “As one’s friend he is one’s own, but he is also other, for one’s friendship depends on his loving in return” (p. 180). Love alone, in contrast, can become estranged from its object or “lead to its conquest” (p. 192). Yet Plato’s account of love in the Phaedrus is formulated precisely to guard against such conquest, so that when the lover finally approaches his beloved the experience is one of “reverence and awe” (254e). This account — later equated by Socrates with the greatest kind of friendship (255b) — does enough to preserve the independence of the beloved object, while also allowing Plato to explore more abstract forms of human attachment, such as the love of wisdom. Reciprocated love may often be desirable in these relationships, but it need not be essential.7

Perhaps the best case of unrequited friendship in Plato is Socrates’ relationship with Athens. As his philosophical activities came to be considered a threat to the city in the late fifth century, what motivated him to continue engaging others in discussion? Socrates’ love of Athens must figure in our answer to this question for two reasons. According to Nichols, our love of others provides us with an important source of self-knowledge: we can know ourselves through loving others, without knowing that we know ourselves (pp. 116-19). The latter second-order sort of awareness is rarely if ever available to us, but there’s value nonetheless in the more unreflective mode of self-knowledge afforded to us in our relationships with others and our lives in communities. This strikes me as a wonderful insight. It also supplies us with a clue as to why Socrates among all other Athenian citizens hardly ever left Athens and refused to flee when given the chance. If membership in his community provided Socrates with a window to his own soul, however foggy and obscure, it would be natural for him to devote his life to conversing with those who could offer him this inarticulable mode of self-knowledge and to reject all attempts to spirit him away from Athens (cf. Phaedrus, 229e-230e; Crito, 51c-54d).

Yet an explanation of Socrates’ love of Athens that stops at the desire for self-knowledge makes him out to be a somewhat selfish lover. In a well-known passage from the Apology where he defends his way of life, he remarks that he is worth far more to the Athenians than they believe by likening his attachment to the city to the role of a gadfly on a noble but sluggish horse (30e), whom he claims to respect and love (philô, 29d). In the Gorgias he goes so far as to declare that he alone among all his contemporaries engages in politics correctly (521d). Both passages suggest that Socrates considered his philosophical vocation a service to the polis, and here I find in his motives a deeper commitment to the life of reason than Nichols is willing to allow. We can say Socrates was a friend to Athens, even if his friendship went unrequited, for he felt that the practice of inquiry and the education of individuals through reasoned argument is ultimately a valuable endeavor. What drives this endeavor is the motivation that drives most educators, perhaps especially philosophers: that the learning engendered privately in the development of a person’s intellect and character can make a difference politically in the development of a larger community. This was arguably Socrates’ greatest legacy to the Athenians. In the final analysis, he was the best friend they never had.

Towards the end of her book, Nichols appeals to a line from the Lysis in which Hippothales describes the title character as “fond of listening”. Plato requires such fondness in all his readers, Nichols informs us, and she follows this principle assiduously in her own study. Although her approach to reading the dialogues often comes at the expense of a more thorough evaluation of Socrates’ arguments, the result is a fine book sensitive to the nuances of Plato’s writing and the subtleties of his thought. Scholars interested in how Plato’s political philosophy might be assessed through the lens of his views on love and friendship would do well to consult this work. Even where Nichols’ interpretations provoke disagreement, there is much to learn from Socrates on Friendship and Community, and much to engage with.

1 If this sounds unfair to Kierkegaard and Nietzsche, I should note that Nichols for the most part restricts her discussion of these authors’ works to Kierkegaard’s Philosophical Fragments and Fear and Trembling and Nietzsche’s Birth of Tragedy and Thus Spoke Zarathustra.

2 Gregory Vlastos, “The Individual as an Object of Love in Plato”, Platonic Studies, 2nd edition (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1981), p. 27n. 80. Nichols quotes the same line on p. 91 in her text. Although he doesn’t tackle the issue, Vlastos raises this topic in his paper as a genuine problem of interpretation that has received insufficient attention in Plato scholarship: “This convergence of mania and nous in love does not seem to intrigue commentators. Few of them notice the paradox at all or, if they do, they seem bent on explaining it away.”

3 In a footnote, Nichols acknowledges a debt to Catherine H. Zuckert’s recently published Plato’s Philosophers: The Coherence of the Dialogues (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2009), particularly for the view that "the dramatically later Lysis presents Plato’s more developed understanding of love and friendship than the dramatically earlier Symposium and Phaedrus" (p. 155n. 9).

4 Another objection to Nichols’ developmental reading is the fact that the moral psychology of the Lysis shares several features with the view Socrates assumes in the Symposium, where happiness is the end of all human desire. This psychological picture contrasts sharply with the tripartite view of the soul on display in the Phaedrus, suggesting (as is customary) that this dialogue was written later in Plato’s career, after he had rejected Socrates’ assumptions about human desire. For further discussion, see A.W. Price, Love and Friendship in Plato and Aristotle, 2nd edition (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1997), pp. 254-5.

5 Cf. Terry Penner and Christopher Rowe, Plato’s Lysis (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005), pp. 307-12, who argue that the view of love Plato develops in the Phaedrus confirms their account of friendship in the Lysis. Penner and Rowe’s commentary is one of the few gaps in Nichols’ otherwise wide-ranging discussion of the secondary literature, but it is a large one, given the place of the Lysis in her study and the value of Penner and Rowe’s work to any serious analysis of this neglected dialogue.

6 Again, note that the range of the Greek philia here extends more widely than our “friendship” to include parental love.

7 I suspect an account of love culminating in reverence would be too pious for Nichols and unable to do justice to the intertwined lives of human beings in complex relationships, but Plato is clear in the Phaedrus that the two individuals he describes eventually as friends share a history together, which narrows much of the distance between them (256a-c).