Sorting the World: On the Relevance of the Kind/Object-Distinction to Referential Semantics

Placeholder book cover

Olav Mueller-Reichau, Sorting the World: On the Relevance of the Kind/Object-Distinction to Referential Semantics, Ontos, 2011, 165pp., $93.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381139.

Reviewed by Antonio Capuano, Auburn University


Consider the following two groups of sentences:


a.     Kimba is eating raw meat.

b.     The lion is eating raw meat.

c.     A lion is eating raw meat.


a.     A lion eats raw meat.

b.     The lion eats raw meat.

c.     Lions eat raw meat

Intuitively, the sentences under (1) can be used to talk about a particular lion that is performing a particular action. By contrast, it does not seem that the sentences under (2) can be used to talk about any particular lion or any particular action a certain lion is performing. They can be used to talk about lions in general and the predicate is what might be called a "characterising predicate". Roughly, they say that lions have the habit of eating raw meat and, intuitively, they would be true even if there is one lion in the world that does not eat raw meat but vegetables. Sentences under (2) are called "generic sentences" and they are the topic of Olav Mueller-Reichau's dissertation, Sorting the World.

In it, Mueller-Reichau both summarizes the ongoing discussion about generic sentences in linguistics and makes a proposal as to how understand and treat such sentences. In a nutshell, his idea is that, on the one hand, generic sentences are characterized by the fact of being kind-level predications and, on the other hand, that kinds are (sortal) concepts.

In this sense, the subtitle, "On the Relevance of the Kind/Object-Distinction to Referential Semantics", could have been "On the Relevance of the Concept/Object-Distinction to Referential Semantics" as well. Of course, the concept/object distinction is not new in philosophy of language. It goes back, at least, to Gottlob Frege, who in fact Mueller-Reichau mentions, even though only in passing. If I mention Frege, however, it is not to say that, after all, nothing new can be found in Mueller-Reichau's book. It is rather to point out that, it seems to me, he ignores most of the observations Saul Kripke and Hilary Putnam have made about what is in the head of speakers when they use proper names or, more relevantly, common nouns. Of course, whether their observations undermine certain views about common nouns depends, at least in part, on what one is trying to accomplish when doing linguistics.

In an old paper, "Semantics -- Mathematics or Psychology?", Barbara Partee asked whether semantics should be seen as a branch of model-theory or, rather, as a branch of cognitive science. If semantics is a branch of cognitive psychology then what is in the head of speakers does matter. Natural language cannot be seen in abstraction as if it were an artificial language like the language of first-order logic. Since Mueller-Reichau does not address this question, it is hard to say what he thinks linguistics is, i.e., a branch of model theory or a branch of cognitive psychology. I bring the question up, however, because he seems to think that "the realm of cognitive psychology and the realm of linguistics overlap when it comes to kinds" (54). As he points out, "on the one hand, kinds are sortal concepts belonging to the general conceptual system. On the other hand, kinds are ontological primitives, i.e., possible referents of linguistic expressions" (54). If he thinks this is the case, however, I believe Kripke and Putnam's observation that one can use and talk about tigers without knowing much about them cannot be simply ignored. It is not simply that he does not mention their names or their works. It is rather that the idea that what speakers know is very little when they use common nouns is not even taken into consideration.

Mueller-Reichau's starting point is Greg Carlson's theory about generic sentences in Reference to Kinds in English. He presents Carlson as basing his theory on a distinction among three classes of entities, i.e., stages, objects, and kinds. While stages are spatiotemporal entities, objects and kinds are abstract entities outside space and time. On Carlson's view, noun phrases can be used to talk about stages, objects, or kinds. To the three kinds of entities there correspond three kinds of predicates, stage-level ("be available", "be hungry", "be drunk", "be dead", "run", etc.), object-level ("be altruistic", "be intelligent", "be a doctor", "be a mammal", etc.), and kind-level ("be widespread", "be common", "be rare", "be extinct") predicates.

One respect in which Mueller-Reichau differs from Carlson is that he does not recognize stages as entities. He recognizes only spatiotemporal objects and non-spatiotemporal abstract kinds as entities. As a consequence, predicates can only be object-level or kind-level. His proposal -- presented in chapter 6 -- can be spelled out by the following three theses:

(1)  natural language predicates manifest themselves in the lexicon exclusively as predicates assigning properties to kinds;

(2)  there is a grammatical operation ("spatiotemporal localisation") converting kind-level predicates into object-level predicates;

(3)  for a subset of lexical kind-level predicates -- in particular, Carlsonian kind-level predicates -- it holds that they involve a semantic component which blocks their spatiotemporal localisation.

The basic idea is that predicates in natural language are kind-level predicates, i.e., they primarily combine with linguistic expressions that stand for kinds, as in "A poodle is a dog". Mueller-Reichau emphasizes that on his view because every lexical predicate is a kind-level predicate "every lexical predicate is predicted to have a generic meaning" (91). However, kind-level predicates can combine with linguistic expressions that stand for objects as well, as in "Fido is a dog". Intuitively, "Fido" is just a name of a dog. As such, it refers to an object. However, the predicate "is a dog" stands for a kind-level predicate. How can semantic composition succeed if the entities composed with each other belong to different ontological levels?

Mueller-Reichau's answer is that "a proper name is in some mysterious way related to a kind to which the kind-level predicate may assign its property" (100). Which kind? It does not seem to be an answer just to say that "every reference to some object automatically implies the reference to some (often) underspecified kind" (100). Unfortunately, there is not much else he has to say to help clarify the point. To point out that kinds are sortal concepts and "there can be no object individuation without categorisation" (102) and that for every object to which one refers there must be some kind as an instance of which one has a perspective on the object is, in my view, of little help if one is trying to give the semantics of sentences like "Fido is a dog".

As I have said, Mueller-Reichau's starting point is Carlson's classification of predicates. In Mueller-Reichau's view, however, both Carlsonian stage-level and object-level predicates turn out to be kind-level predicates. Surprisingly though, those that Carlson classifies as kind-level predicates, like be extinct, or be invented, turn out not to be "pure" kind predicates in Mueller-Reichau's theory. "The reason is that the property assignment of predicates like be extinctdie out, etc. involves conditions imposed on the mode of existence of object instances of the kind. Thus, the property assigned is not a 'pure' kind property" (88). He proposes "to analyze Carlsonian kind-level predicates as complex existence predicates" (88). Mueller-Reichau's idea is that a sentence like "Dinosaurs died out" says something about the relationship between the realm of kinds and the realm of objects. In this case, it says that in the spatiotemporal realm of objects there are no longer instances of the kind dinosaur. In this sense, according to Mueller-Reichau, they behave like the existence predicate, which is used in English to assert a certain relation between the realm of concepts and the realm of objects. It stands for "a property of a description of an entity, specifically the property that the description is instantiated by some entity at some index" (37).

Mueller-Reichau's proposal, as I mentioned above, consists in the theses that predicates in English are kind-level predicates and that kinds are sortal concepts. What does it mean that kinds are sortal concepts? This is not completely clear to me. Mueller-Reichau seems to think that to say that kinds are sortal concepts is to say that we use kinds to classify objects in the world. Kinds are like a mental catalogue that serves "to categorize and individuate objects" (21). Furthermore, "being mental by nature, kinds 'exist' in a different way than real objects exist. Objects exist in space and time, kinds do not. In other words, objects are particulars, kinds are non-particulars" (21). As Mueller-Reichau explains,

right from the beginning of our own existence, we perceive the objects in our environment qua objects, i.e., as instances of the general kind 'physical object'. Later on, at the age of about one year, we learn to sort (physical) objects into kinds of objects, following the linguistic practice of the social group within which we grow up. This goes together with the development of our first nominal lexicon consisting of linguistic symbols for basic-level kinds: by observing the way a particular common noun is used we establish for it a mental representation (concept). This process of inducing a concept presupposes sufficient knowledge about the extension of the noun (35).

I do not want to question the psychological research he mentions to support his view, although there seems to be problems there. For instance, it is not clear that to recognize the same squirrel twice one must be able to categorize it and see it as an instance of any kind. But even if we assume he is right about this, nothing really important for his proposal seems to me to heavily depend on it.

What confuses me most is what he has to say about the metaphysics of kinds. I do not see why the fact that they are mental makes them outside space and time and why the fact of being abstract makes them non-particulars, as Mueller-Reichau seems to suggest. And it is not clear to me that, in his picture, kinds can really be outside space and time. Computers did not exist one hundred years ago. Therefore, there was no instance of the kind computer in the real worldHowever, as Mueller-Reichau says: "for a kind (sortal concept) to exist means to have object instances in the real world" (38). If I understand him correctly, this means that the kind computer did not exist one hundred years ago and came into existence as soon as the first computer was invented. But then how can kinds be outside space and time if there was a time when the kind computer did not exist?

This remark about what it is for a kind to exist is confusing for another reason. According to Mueller-Reichau, "choosing a certain thing as the topic implies its existence within the domain of possible referents" (22). This is for him "for trivial reasons" (22). I take it that for him when one utters, "The lion exists", "the lion" stands for the kindlion and thus the latter must exist. How could then "the unicorn does not exist" be true or even meaningful? I take it that, on his view, for the sentence to be meaningful "the unicorn" must stand for the kind unicorn. To say that the kind unicorn does not exist, however, is to say that it does not have instances in the real world. But then, according to Mueller-Reichau, the kind unicorn does not exist. How could then the sentence "the unicorn does not exist" be meaningful?

But let us put the metaphysics of kinds aside. I wish Mueller-Reichau had said more about how his semantic proposal works. It would have helped clarify a couple of points I am not sure I understood.

Consider the sentence, "A poodle is a dog". As Mueller-Reichau explains it, sentences like this "are uttered in order to ascribe a kind-level property to the kind denoted by the subject-NP. The denoted kind then forms the topic of the utterance" (99). As a consequence of this analysis, the sentences are not used to talk about objects at all. For Mueller-Reichau, this means that "these sentences do not impose any truth-conditions on the object domain. This is a welcome consequence because it helps to understand the well-known peculiarity of generic predications that is so notoriously difficult to deal with in truth conditional semantic terms" (99). The difficulty is that of accounting for the fact that a generic sentence such as "the dog is four-legged" can be true even if the only dogs alive have all lost one leg and have only three legs. Mueller-Reichau thinks his proposal explains it because

the truth or falsity of a normal kind-level predication is fully determinable by evaluating the conditions holding in the kind domain. If the conditions asserted by a normal kind-level predication map the conditions holding in the kind domain, the respective sentence will be true (109),

independently of what is true at the object level. Therefore, "the dog is four-legged" can be true even if no dog alive has four legs, as long as the predicate being four-legged is true of the kind. Take Mueller-Reichau's analysis of another sentence he considers a generic sentence, "The dodo is a bird." It is true at time t0 if the following holds at t0:

(1)  Within the kind domain, there is the kind 'dodo'.

(2)  Within the kind domain, there is the kind 'bird'.

(3)  The kind 'dodo' is a subkind of the kind 'bird'.

Now, let us consider the sentence "the whale is a fish". It is true at time t0 if the following holds at t0:

(1)  Within the kind domain, there is the kind 'whale'.

(2)  Within the kind domain, there is the kind 'fish'.

(3)  The kind 'whale' is a subkind of the kind 'fish'.

Now, consider at time t0 before we discover that whales are not fish but mammals. Since kinds are sortal concepts isn't there a time where the three conditions above hold? If the answer is yes doesn't it imply that the sentence "the whale is a fish" is true at that time? I am not sure what Mueller-Reichau would say in this respect.

I think that a similar problem could possibly arise with sentences that have a proper name in subject position. Consider the sentence "Fido barks", where bark is read not episodically and has instead a generic interpretation. It asserts that Fido has the habit of barking. Mueller-Reichau claims that in such a case the proper name "Fido" both refers to a particular object and the underlying kind. The idea is that "the topic of the utterance is an object, namely Fido, but the predication nevertheless targets a kind, namely the kind underlying Fido" (101). Does this not have the undesired consequence that whether "Fido barks" is true or false has nothing to do with what Fido does? The sentence can be true even in a scenario where Fido has never barked. For the sentence to be true, in fact, it is enough that the predication is true of the underlying kind. Again, I am not sure what Mueller-Reichau would say in this respect.[1]

[1] I wish to thank Andrea Bianchi for comments and suggestions.