Sounding/Silence: Martin Heidegger at the Limits of Poetics

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David Nowell Smith, Sounding/Silence: Martin Heidegger at the Limits of Poetics, Fordham University Press, 2013, 237pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823251537.

Reviewed by Krzysztof Ziarek, University at Buffalo


In this fine, complex, and thought-provoking study, Nowell Smith reappraises the importance of Heidegger's long engagement with poetry for the question of poetics. His central claim is that, despite Heidegger's pronouncements about his lack of interest or even appreciation for aesthetic approaches to art or for formal features of poetic texts, Heidegger's readings of poetry demonstrate less a rejection of poetics -- or aesthetics more broadly speaking -- than an intricate "reevaluation" of poetry's formal traits (p. 4). Perhaps even more important, he also shows how these features of poetic language are frequently deployed by Heidegger to reframe in important ways his own thinking and to extend its limits. Especially impressive is the eloquent way in which Nowell Smith shows that Heidegger's readings of poetry, often deemed idiosyncratic or even failed by literary critics and philosophers alike, in fact allow us to rethink both the scope and some crucial issues of poetics. In this context, Chapter 4, "Reading Heidegger Reading," becomes pivotal to the book's argument, since it traces, through convincing elaboration of Heidegger's take on Georg Trakl and on the notion of poetic measure in Hölderlin, the specifics of Heidegger's departure from literary interpretation or textual exegesis. In the process, Nowell Smith suggests his own ways of reading beyond Heidegger, especially with regard to poetic tropes and the role of the body in the sounding of language and the opening of intelligibility.

Nowell Smith's elucidation of the importance of Heidegger for rethinking poetics is anchored in the way Heidegger "poses the question of the truth of poetry, that is, the openness that it makes possible through its naming" (195). This openness is not only disclosure or comprehensibility but indicates the opening that makes revealing possible in the first place. Nowell Smith's glosses on the aletheic working of art and poetry, on the "firstness" characteristic of how artworks inaugurate the open space of the intelligibility of beings, are among the most noteworthy and illuminating contributions of his book: "the work projects an open region in which beings enter into unconcealment (aletheia) in a singular way, thus appearing as though for the first time" (20). Performing its own entry into appearance, its "createdness," the work of art alters the parameters of the disclosure of beings it brings into the open, that is, of the world it projects, thus also shifting the limits of its autodisclosure. Nowell Smith is right to indicate that the core of Heidegger's thinking of art lies precisely in understanding the way in which the artwork's shaping of the projection of the open "may also shape the parameters of autodisclosure as such" (43). The shift in the limits of openness and of the intelligibility such a change enacts marks the working of truth in art and points to the critical import of poetry for thinking.

The book's first chapter is devoted largely to explicating, through a careful reading of "The Origin of the Work of Art" and various critical commentaries on it, the artwork's inauguration of the open region in which beings and their relations take shape. Looking at the jointures and rhythmicity of the artwork, Nowell Smith argues that Heidegger's notion of the figure (Gestalt) can be seen not simply to break with the metaphysical-aesthetic tradition, but also to offer a subtle recalibration of the notion of form precisely by looking at the way in which art's material affords disclosure through its opacity, that is, through the withdrawal of "the earth" from the openness of the world. It is in this changed approach to form, in the rhythm of Dichtung extending beyond prosody and "even beyond the 'linguistic work' as a whole," (59) that Nowell Smith sees Heidegger's significance for poetics. It has to do specifically with how Heidegger's texts, engaging with the verbal language, at the same time examine the underlying movement of disclosure that brings language into its articulated, verbal form: "it is only by grasping verbal language in its wholeness that we can first encounter the gathering movement underlying it" (67).

Much in agreement with this approach, I would highlight in this context one more issue that does not receive enough attention and that has, it seems to me, crucial implications for considering Heidegger's relation to poetics and aesthetics more broadly: namely, the fact that the strife between earth and world overlaps but does not coincide with material/form relation, even in the modified shape it receives in Nowell Smith's reading of "The Origin of the Work of Art." For this reason it may be important to draw a distinction between poetics, which operates in the "aesthetic" realm of material and form, and poietics, which pertains to the "strife" of earth and world. What constitutes the poetics of the artwork is the drawing out -- through the movement between material and form -- of the Gestalt of the strife. In this way, Gestalt does not coincide with form, which could be said to trace the work's relation to or its bearing upon reality external to it, just as it is also not equivalent to the artistic bind between form and material. Rather, it instantiates the shifting juncture between the artwork and reality, shaping matter/form into bearing the strife of earth/world. In short, poetics both envelops or situates poetics and comes to be figured in it.

This tension and non-coincidence between poietics and poetics is precisely what, beyond simply binding the artwork to the world in which it is created, also allows art to alter the parameters of the world's openness and of the way it conditions the manifestation of beings. This spanning non-coincidence maps art's relation to "reality" in terms of transformation, or shift in limits, asNowell Smith prefers to characterize it. The distinction between poetics and poietics seems to me consonant with the book's argument, as it highlights how the artwork's projection of the open alters the possibilities of disclosure and intelligibility as such. What is crucial, and here I am in complete agreement with Nowell Smith, is that this transformative relation is not reducible to or thinkable as mimesis, representation, or, especially with regard to poetry, signification.

The overlap and divergence characteristic of such twofold po(i)etics can also provide the backdrop to another important issue, addressed in Chapter 3, namely the question of metaphoricity and Heidegger's repeated dismissal of poetic figures in spite of his repeated use of what looks like metaphor ("the house of being") and metonymy. What from the perspective of poetics reads like a metaphor or perhaps metaphoricity, from the perspective of poietics is no longer containable within poetic figures or even in the work of language as such, when the latter is grasped in terms of system, code, or play of signification. Nowell Smith is well aware of this issue, as he suggests that trying to give a name, like metaphoricity, to the fault between language work and language essence, seeks "to familiarize a strangeness that itself continually calls into question such need for familiarity" (113). He links this strangeness and opacity to the body and the ways in which in Heidegger's thinking it "articulates" itself in language beyond its verbal work, even if Heidegger himself does not often treat it explicitly in such terms.

In an excellent discussion of bodying forth in Heidegger (121-125), Nowell Smith shows that treating poetic language as essentially figurative or rhetorical "is blind to the originary openness that first makes it [metaphor] possible" (123) The transfer at issue in Heidegger does not occur within language as it is habitually conceived, say as the slide between the literal and the figural, but rather as the way to language. Nowell Smith's spot-on analysis lets me add that "bodying forth" in Heidegger needs to be thought first not with regard to the body -- and the attendant split between the sensuous and non-sensuous -- but in terms of being-in-the-world or, in later Heidegger, of dwelling. Thus any understanding of the body has to be itself situated within the event, and it has to begin not with the body per se but with the place in the relatedness of the world where the body arises, that is, bodies forth, in relation to the event.

The key to understanding and appreciating the significance of Nowell Smith's contribution appears in Chapter 2, "The Naming Power of the Word," which focuses on Heidegger's understanding of language and offers a crucial rejoinder to the predominant interpretations that tend to explain (poetic) language and Heidegger's engagement with it in terms of signification. Counter to post-Saussurean interpretations, Sounding/Silence shows that Heidegger "calls into question the very framework of the dyadic linguistic sign" (69), so that what remains unsaid cannot be explained as belonging to the structure of signification as its interruption or negation. Instead, at issue is the manner in which verbal language and signification inhabit an open and "silent" space of manifestation, which allows them to have meaning in the first place. Verbal language becomes a sounding in words of this silent region: "The clearing must be anterior to any verbal articulation: insofar as language comes to sound only when it enters human discourse, a clearing that precedes and conditions human openness must be silent -- at least to human ears" (87).

In Language after Heidegger, I suggest that this complex relation between silence/stillness (Stille) and verbal language can be understood in terms of the transfer between (silent) words (Worte) and the play of signs (Wörter).[1] Nowell Smith brings up this distinction, yet looks at it in terms of the difference between "merely" verbal language and "discourse" in the sense used in Being and Time (67). The recently published GA 71, Das Ereignis and GA 74, Zum Wesen der Sprach und Zur Frage nach der Kunst[2] suggest an even more crucial role given by Heidegger to the notion of the word (das Wort), which though silent and non-verbal, is nonetheless essential to language, that is, it bespeaks the very movement, the way-making, that brings the essence of language into articulation. In fact, Heidegger goes as far as to write that "Das Ereignis wortet" ("The event words"), which means that the emergence of the openness for intelligibility is already a language before language: a gathering of "silent" words on the way to verbal language, that is, to the sounding (Verlautbarung) into signs. Differently put, the event occurs as the non-human language of being underway to articulation in human language(s).

This sense of the event provides the perspective for situating the stakes and practices of Heidegger's unconventional texts on poetry. If at issue in the encounter with artworks is their preservation (Bewahrung), that is, letting the truth at work in them inflect thought and change the limits of the intelligible, then Heidegger's extended engagement with poetry should be understood, as Nowell Smith proposes, not exegetically but rather as a preservation of preservation. Approaching Heidegger's texts on poetry with the expectation and standards of literary interpretation not only continues to hold to the assumptions about language and poetry that Heidegger calls into question, but also fundamentally misrecognizes the manner in which poetry can modify the openness in which what exists becomes manifest. Assuming that it were possible to ascribe a unitary orientation to the diverse occasions of Heidegger's courses, lectures, and talks about poetry, it seems that many of these texts serve largely as a preparation of thinking for encountering the poetic text in the mode of preservation. Precisely because thought, whether in philosophy or literary criticism, approaches poetry predominantly with a view to interpretation and analysis, Heidegger's essays can be seen as evolving an idiomatic set of practices that break with these assumptions and goals.

In a way, these texts are concerned less with poetry per se than with ways of inflecting thought so that it becomes responsive to the unthought of poetic texts. They are indeed double but perhaps in a slightly different manner than Nowell Smith suggests: Heidegger attempts to tease out the unthought from poetry (Dichten) in order to draw out the unthought in thinking (Denken), and in the process to get thinking ready to engage with, that is, "to preserve," the working of truth in the poetic text. This is why Heidegger rarely reads poems as complete texts or as literary works, but instead focuses more on particular phrases or unthought textual shifts. This may be also why he often concludes these essays by re-quoting the poetry in question, as if only at the end of his texts thought might become finally ready to read/"preserve" the poem. Since the unthought of poetry has to do precisely with the "way-making" of language and the manner in which it dislodges and shifts the limits of the openness for beings, Heidegger's "reading" of poetry sets out to transfer the momentum of poetic language to thought. In this sense, Heidegger's insights, however one might measure or assess them, are only secondarily of import to poetics since their primary concern remains a transformation of thinking through twisting free (Verwindung) of metaphysics, which Heidegger claims can happen through a transformation of our relation to language. Nonetheless, as Nowell Smith points out, Heidegger's approach prompts a fundamental reassessment of the stakes, limits, and practices of poetics. Yet toward this end, these texts by Heidegger need to be to read beyond his own idiomatic approach, in part because Heidegger's interest lies elsewhere and in part because a fully developed poetics would require looking at aspects of poetry that Heidegger does not consider or merely touches upon. A major component of such a reappraisal of poetics would indeed be, as the book demonstrates admirably, the consideration of the role of the bodily dimension in the rise of language, that is, in the sounding of the openness for experience and thought that language enacts.

This book is an important and impressive achievement, first, for clearing away many misinterpretations about Heidegger's engagement with poetry and, second, for drawing the outline of a Heidegger-inspired shift in poetics. While it is primarily a contribution to "Heidegger studies," notable especially for illuminating discussions of language, the working of artworks, and the ramifications of Heidegger's readings of poetry, it also offers important insights for adapting poetics, in particular for how to engage with poetic texts beyond the limits of interpretation and without the exclusive or even primary focus on signification.

Lucid and engaging, the book is approachable even for those not significantly versed in Heidegger, as Nowell Smith takes care to explain eloquently Heidegger's main notions and provides illuminating glosses or paraphrases of excerpts from Heidegger crucial to his own argument. What are most revealing and thought-provoking are his remarks about the echoes of materiality in the sounding (out) of silence, silence that frames Heidegger's idiomatic approach to language. It is there that I see the challenge and the opportunity this book extends. They have to do with rethinking materiality in language with regard to its broader implication, specifically its emplacement within the experience of the world. Since in Contributions to Philosophy and elsewhere Heidegger writes that Da-sein, being-there, needs to be kept in relation to "the clearing of beyng [Seyn]" that is non-human through and through,[3] language and its material dimensions need to be sited within the non- or more than human event of the world, from which they draw their ontological modalities and "sustenance." The "wording" silence of this event needs to be thought with regard to the late Heideggerian idiom of "letting be" and oriented within the topographic of what Heidegger calls the Ortschaft, the emplacement or "sitedness," spatio-temporal and historical, of each moment of being.

[1] Krzysztof Ziarek, Language After Heidegger (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2013).

[2] Martin Heidegger, Das EreignisGesamtausgabe, vol. 71 (Frankfurt am Main: Klostermann, 2009); translated as The Event, trans. Richard Rojcewicz (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2013); Gesamtausgabe, vol. 74 (Frankfurt am Main: Klostermann, 2010).

[3] "This realm [that is, the clearing] is nevertheless utterly non-human [durch und durch nicht menschlich]; i.e. it cannot be determined and borne by animal rationale and just as little by thesubjectum." Martin Heidegger, Contributions to Philosophy (Of the Event), trans. Richard Rojcewicz and Daniela Vallega-Neu (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2013), 385.