Sounds and Perception: New Philosophical Essays

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Matthew Nudds and Casey O'Callaghan (eds.), Sounds and Perception: New Philosophical Essays, Oxford UP, 2009, 270pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199282968.

Reviewed by Andrew Kania, Trinity University


This volume comprises ten excellent recent essays on the philosophy of sounds and auditory perception. (Two essays -- those by Roy Sorensen and Andy Hamilton -- though relatively new, have already appeared in monographs by their authors, and a third -- by Casey O'Callaghan -- is a summary of the main conclusions of his recent monograph Sounds. Nonetheless, anyone interested in the philosophy of sounds will welcome their inclusion in this volume.) The editors provide an introductory essay which serves to helpfully introduce not only the volume, but also the field of philosophy of sound as a whole.

As the title implies, the essays cluster around two topics -- ontological theories of sounds and theories of auditory perception -- but these topics are so intertwined that the book feels more like it is divided according to three kinds of sounds: the majority of essays in the volume (six out of ten) examine the nature of ordinary sounds and our perception of them; the three last essays are concerned with the nature, but particularly with our perception of, the sounds of speech; and the remaining essay is dedicated to the nature and perception of musical sounds.

At least three essays complicate this taxonomy, however. In the six essays on ordinary sounds I include Sorensen's characteristically thought-provoking argument that one of the things we ordinarily hear is not sound but silence. Roger Scruton's essay advances an ontological theory of sounds, but one closely tied to, if not solely motivated by, his theory of musical perception. Finally, Barry Smith provides a nice link between the essays on ordinary sounds and those on speech perception, arguing that when we hear speech we hear a special kind of sound-source -- the voice of a subject -- which can explain the direct 'meeting of minds' we seem to experience when listening to speech.

The bulk of the book, then, is devoted to the question of what sounds are and what our experience of them is like. These topics are so intertwined because sounds seem prima facie to be connected to auditory perception. What are sounds if not that which we hear? This contrasts with vision -- the perceptual mode which has dominated philosophical and psychological theorizing about perception -- as is clear from the unavailability of a parallel rhetorical question in the visual domain. This point emerges methodologically throughout the essays on ordinary sounds as a principle (sometimes stated explicitly, sometimes not) that theories of sounds and auditory perception should not, ceteris paribus, imply that we are systematically mistaken in what we think we hear.

Several authors classify theories of sounds according to their location relative to the hearer. Thus distal theories place sounds at their sources, proximal theories locate them where the listener is (say, at her eardrum), and medial theories locate them somewhere in between (typically where sound waves are), while aspatial theories claim they exist at no spatial location. This menu of options is repeated when we turn to theories of auditory perception: do we hear sounds as occurring where we are, where their sources reside, somewhere in between, or nowhere at all? You might think, especially given the methodological principle just noted, that theorists should pick matching theories of sounds and auditory perception. If, for example, you think sounds are object-involving vibrational events (a distal theory), then you ought to think that we hear them as distant from us.

While some authors do have such matching views, various considerations complicate the picture. The distal theorists have it easiest in this regard. Roberto Casati and Jérôme Dokic argue that sounds are events of objects vibrating, while O'Callaghan argues that they are events of objects vibrating in a medium. Both agree, however, that we hear sounds as located where those events occur, namely, at their sources. Brian O'Shaughnessy, by contrast, argues that sounds are the waves that result from such events, and thus that they occupy (roughly) an expanding sphere of space, but that we only hear them where we are -- when the waves hit our eardrums. Sorensen defends a similar view, though he is more willing to say that we hear sounds as located at their sources. A more complicated view is defended by Matthew Nudds, who argues that sounds are abstract individuals -- frequency-component patterns, located where they are instantiated -- but that we do not hear them as located at all. Rather, we hear the location of the sources of sounds by way of an aspatial auditory experience of the sounds themselves. Nudds thus explains away the systematic auditory illusion that his theory seems at first to attribute to us as a persistent metonymy.

Of the theorists of ordinary sounds in the volume this leaves Scruton who, in a typically wide-ranging discussion, argues that current theorizing about sound is blinkered by an undermotivated commitment to physicalism. Scruton argues that sounds are 'pure events': 'secondary objects' whose 'existence, nature, and qualities are all determined by how things appear to the normal observer' (59), events that happen, but do not happen to anything (61). Scruton assumes auditory perception is spatial, and thus sees sounds as spatially located, but only vaguely -- like rainbows. This allows him to defend the claim, central to his philosophy of music, that sounds are heard as distinct from their sources (acousmatic hearing), bearing relations to one another that are not rooted in physical facts about their sources.

The following is a common argument schema used to defend these various theories, invoking the methodological principle described earlier:

1. Auditory perception is thus-and-so.

2. If auditory perception is thus-and-so, and we are not systematically deceived in our auditory perception, then sounds must (not) be this kind of thing.

3. Therefore, sounds must (not) be this kind of thing.

While there is sometimes dispute over the conditional claims, the disagreement tends to focus on characterizations of auditory perception. For instance, Scruton's argument depends on his claim that 'music is an extreme case of something that we witness throughout the sound world, which is the internal organization of sounds as pure events' (64). I am not sure this claim can bear the weight Scruton requires of it. In his essay devoted to music, Andy Hamilton compellingly argues that even proper musical experience requires both acousmatic and non-acousmatic hearing; we properly hear musical sounds as coming from their sources (such as instruments) as well as in musical terms (e.g. as an appropriate chord to follow what has come before). Thus it seems an open question whether the acousmatic experience is a feature of ordinary auditory perception. (It doesn't help that the empirical evidence Scruton cites to support his view depends on musical, not ordinary, sonic stimuli.)

While I think Scruton's argument for his positive view is underdeveloped, his arguments against taking physicalism for granted deserve close consideration (and not just by theorists of sounds). Scruton's essay comes closest, among those on ordinary sounds, to addressing methodological questions concerning the first premise in the schema given above -- questions about how we ought to go about trying to correctly characterize the nature of auditory perception. I found myself wishing for more such reflection, since without it, it is difficult to adjudicate between the different claims made about the nature of auditory perception and thus to judge the strength of the arguments that depend on them.

Distal theorists, for example, unsurprisingly deny that our auditory experience is acousmatic, as Scruton characterizes it. Nudds claims that our 'normal ways of individuating sounds' are best served by the view that they are 'particularized types or abstract individuals' (76), a claim at least implicitly rejected by the other theorists in the volume. There is also dispute over whether our auditory phenomenology is of hearing sounds distally. The different kinds of evidence marshaled to defend positions on these issues compounds concerns about methodology. For instance, distal theorists rely on ordinary responses to sounds, such as our looking in the direction of the source of a sound, while Nudds (an aspatial theorist) relies on empirical psychological data to argue that we do not hear sounds to be spatially located.

Two of the essays on speech perception, by contrast, are very explicitly methodological. Robert E. Remez and J.D. Trout argue, with minor qualifications, that philosophers (or at least traditional philosophical methods) ought to get out of the business of theories of speech perception altogether. In this final essay in the volume, they point out that despite the evidence that introspection and phenomenological analysis are fallible, these methods are still given disproportionate weight in theories of speech perception. For instance, they argue that the main reason theories of speech perception tend to be based on the idea that speech is constituted out of discrete phonemes is that we can distinguish minimal pairs of phonemes. But the empirical evidence shows that such distinctions are the exception, and that ordinary speech is 'coarticulated' throughout -- each sound a combination of phonemes in the immediate vicinity. Though Remez and Trout reserve their criticisms for theorists of speech perception, it is not difficult to imagine the same points redirected at many of the arguments about ordinary sounds and auditory perception earlier in the book. However, apart from a section of the introduction, there is not much more than token consideration of such issues elsewhere.

Christopher Mole's essay on the popular 'Motor Theory' of speech perception is a textbook example of philosophical critique of empirical theorizing. He attacks the theory from two directions. First, he argues that the phenomena the theory is supposed to explain are for the most part not phenomena restricted to speech perception. Thus no theory that is restricted to speech perception, as the Motor Theory is, will count as a good explanation of those phenomena. Second, he argues that the Motor Theory, though first formulated in the 1960s and substantially revised in the 1980s, is either trivial or obviously false. It is trivial if it claims merely that the objects of speech perception are 'intended phonemic gestures', since any theory of speech perception is a theory that takes such things as its object; it is obviously false if it implies that listeners hear speech under concepts of intended phonemic gestures.

Mole's essay is not wholly negative, however. He suggests that Motor Theorists gave up too easily on the original formulation, according to which speech-production mechanisms are involved in speech comprehension, moving to a revised theory according to which models of production mechanisms are involved in comprehension. After arguing that no such model-theory could work, he argues that the reasons for giving up on the original theory -- that people lacking certain productive abilities could nonetheless comprehend what they could not produce -- were insufficient. Such an objection would only be devastating to a theory according to which there was complete overlap between mechanisms of production and comprehension, but one need not accept so strong a formulation.

In juxtaposition with the essays on ordinary sounds, these two essays suggest more the distance between the two areas of study, in terms of both central issues and the amount of extant work in the field. Smith's essay on speech perception, by contrast, is a nice example of how the two areas can be fruitfully connected. Smith is concerned with refuting a McDowellian theory of meaning as 'on the surface' of speech and thus communicated quite literally from speaker to audience. Employing a wealth of empirical data on speech perception, he argues rather that listeners contribute much of what they hear in speech, from missing phonemes and word-boundaries to the meanings of the resulting reconstituted linguistic items. His theory of the subject's voice as a special sound source is then used to explain away the main motivation for the McDowellian view: the direct 'meeting of minds' we seem to experience when listening to speech.

The essays in this book all show that the philosophy of sound and auditory perception can be as complex, interesting, difficult, rewarding, and important as the much more commonly explored topics of physical objects and vision. The volume should be of interest to anyone interested in ontology or perception, whether or not they have thought seriously about sounds before. Rather than substantive objections, the few critical comments I have made above are really a plea for more work to be done in the area -- particularly on methodological questions. I take this as a sign that the philosophy of sound is transitioning from an emerging topic to an established area of philosophy, a transition this volume will doubtless speed along and which is something to be celebrated.