Sources of Knowledge: On the Concept of a Rational Capacity for Knowledge

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Andrea Kern, Sources of Knowledge: On the Concept of a Rational Capacity for Knowledge, Daniel Smyth (tr.), Harvard University Press, 2017, 295pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674416116.

Reviewed by Allan Hazlett, University of New Mexico


In this impressive book, Andrea Kern offers a response to philosophical skepticism and an account of the nature of knowledge. Her leading idea is that knowledge is an act of a "rational capacity for knowledge," the exercise of which provides the knower with "truth-guaranteeing grounds" for belief, such as your perceiving that there is a tree in the quad, which grounds your knowledge that there is a tree in the quad. Kern presents her argument as a series of Kantian insights, which makes the book an important one, representing an admirable effort to bring Kant's epistemology into dialogue with contemporary analytic epistemology, on which Descartes and Hume have (you might think) an out-sized influence.

Kern's discussion is weakened by repeated exaggerations of the originality of her proposals and by frequent maligning of contemporary epistemology for not having engaged with them before. This is due in part, but only in part, to the fact that Sources of Knowledge was originally published in 2006 and is here translated for the first time into English from the German. Several of Kern's contributions may have been novel in 2006, but they are not novel in 2017, and several of Kern's claims about the contemporary literature are dated. This would matter less if the originality of the book's central ideas were less frequently invoked as motivation for their discussion. In any event, here I would like to focus on three aspects of Kern's approach that do strike me as novel, or at least relatively unusual in the landscape of contemporary epistemology. I will not discuss her anti-skeptical appeal to a disjunctivist philosophy of perception (Chapter 5), her articulation of a virtue-theoretic account of knowledge (Chapters 6-8), or her defense of (although she does not call it this) knowledge-first epistemology (pp. 119-25 and passim).

First, Kern defends a kind of infallibilism, on which knowledge requires "truth-guaranteeing grounds," i.e. grounds which guarantee the truth of the belief for which they are grounds (pp. 46-50), or, to put this another way, on which justification entails truth (pp. 31-36). Kern correctly identifies the rejection of this premise as a common theme in contemporary epistemology, calling positions which reject this kind of infallibilism "positions of moderation." (p. 79) (Kern's view would have been familiar to the ancients, being equivalent to the Stoic theory of "kataleptic impressions.") Her rejection of "positions of moderation" is the basis of her criticism of the main rival to her view: the sort of virtue-theoretic account of knowledge on which knowledge is a manifestation of intellectual competence, defended by Ernest Sosa (and others). The central problem for Sosa is that, on his account, "it is perfectly intelligible for someone to possess the relevant competence and exercise it under conditions that are appropriate for its exercise and yet fail to exercise it successfully." (p. 234) To put this another way, for Sosa, intellectual competences are fallible capacities to form true beliefs, capacities which could fail to deliver a true belief, even when exercised under appropriate conditions.

Kern rejects this: "An epistemic capacity must be a general characteristic of a subject that guarantees truth." (p. 236) Kern's argument for this is that if a competence is fallible, in the present sense, "whenever the competence is exercised in the appropriate circumstances, its success or failure must be a matter of luck -- a chance occurrence," which, when combined with the assumption that knowledge is a manifestation of intellectual competence, fails to secure the non-accidentality of knowledge (p. 235). But it is hard to see why we should think of the successful exercise of a fallible competence as lucky or a matter of chance. Expert shooters might hit the target 9 times out of 10, even under ideal conditions; shall we say that they are only hitting the target by luck? Kern is right to point out that there is a sense in which the shooters' successes are lucky (p. 235): they are not entailed by their exercising their competence in ideal conditions. But it is unclear why we should think of knowledge as being non-lucky in that sense.

Second, Kern argues that "rational capacities for knowledge" -- by contrast with the intellectual competences posited by other virtue epistemologies -- require us to recognize a sui generis species of "teleological" causation, distinct from the more familiar species of efficient or "mechanical" causation (pp. 238-46). Our rational capacities for knowledge cause us to know particular things, but this causation is "teleological" rather than "mechanical." Kern's paradigm case of "teleological" causation, borrowed from Kant, is a house built for the purpose of earning rental income. The house causes the landlord to earn rental income, but not in the usual "mechanical" way, because in this case causation goes both ways: the prospect of rental income was also what caused the landlord to build the house in the first place. "To give a complete account of the cause of the rental income," therefore, "we would have to include some reference to the rational being who has a certain conceptual representation of the effect of the house, which representation leads her to build the house." (p. 242) The same is true, Kern argues, in the case of knowledge: to give a complete account of the cause of our knowing particular things, we need to include some reference to our conceptual representation of knowledge as our aim. This argument, along with the Kantian critique of the Humean idea of an "implanted subjective disposition" for knowledge (pp. 246-53) is a useful contribution to on-going debates in contemporary epistemology about the teleology of belief and "epistemic normativity." But anyone familiar with those debates will recognize Kern's dichotomy as too blunt. There are myriad possible positions lying between the view (which Kern attributes to Sosa) that the teleology of belief is merely a matter of believers being reliably disposed to form true beliefs (p. 233) and the view (which Kern endorses) that the teleology of belief requires believers to consciously represent knowledge as their aim.

Third, Kern proposes an extreme form of epistemological internalism, on which knowledge requires conscious awareness of an exercise of a rational capacity for knowledge (pp. 176-81, pp. 246-53), as well as knowing that you know (pp. 121-2). I say this view is "extreme" because it goes much further than familiar "internalist" accounts, which require only that you be able to justify your knowledge in the space of reasons or that you possess justifying evidence that supervenes on your total mental state. Kern's account of the nature of knowledge completely rules out the possibility of "animal knowledge" -- i.e. knowledge without conscious awareness of its source -- which seems to be the only kind of "knowledge" available to non-human animals, human children, and most of us most of the time. This is not necessarily a mark against Kern's account. But her discussion and critique of contemporary epistemology, and contemporary virtue epistemology in particular, seemed insensitive to its origins in philosophical naturalism, tracing back to Hume, for which human cognition is contiguous with animal cognition, rather than being something sui generis. It is no surprise that Kern's Kantian epistemology thus clashes with the Humean epistemologies she opposes, but a more charitable engagement with their motivations would have made for a more enlightening discussion.

Before concluding, it's worth noting that Kern's articulation of the skeptical problem (Chapters 1 and 2) is also somewhat unusual relative to contemporary epistemology. Kern appeals, in the first instance, to Agrippa's trilemma, and nowhere discusses the much-discussed "closure principle" that many contemporary epistemologists target as central to the skeptical problem. However, Kern seems to conflate Agrippa's trilemma with the argument from illusion, or what she calls the "argument from the possibility of error." (p. 65) This, I believe, is a mistake. Agrippa's trilemma is designed to target any belief whatsoever -- the idea is that it is impossible to justify any belief, because any possible justification would have to be either infinitely regressive, circular, or based on an unjustified assumption. The argument from the possibility of error, by contrast, as Kern formulates it, relies on premises about "perceptual experience." (p. 65) So these two arguments cannot really be the same. The same mistake, it seems to me, is behind Kern's choice to treat perceptual knowledge and testimonial knowledge as representative of knowledge in general (p. 58), with a resulting focus on "sensory experience" (p. 111 and passim) as a ground for knowledge. Kern does not make clear how we are meant to generalize her account of perceptual knowledge to cover knowledge in general, and it struck me as important that Kern's Kantian account of the origin of our rational capacity for experiential knowledge (pp. 254-6) appealed to species of a priori knowledge, which was presumably unthreatened by the skeptical argument.

I have raised some worries here about Kern's views and arguments, but there is much to like about this book. It is ambitious, it is generally well-argued, and the writing is clear and lucid -- or at least as clear and lucid as can be expected when articulating some difficult ideas. It is a good book, and a welcome attempt to bring Kantian thinking into the contemporary epistemological discussion.