Spandrels of Truth

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JC Beall, Spandrels of Truth, Oxford UP, 2009, 154pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199268733.

Reviewed by Wen-fang Wang, Institute of Philosophy of Mind and Cognition at National Yang Ming University, Taiwan



In Spandrels of Truth, JC Beall concisely presents and defends a simple, modest, dialetheic approach to truth and semantic paradoxes. As indicated by the title, Beall holds that paradoxical sentences are just spandrels, i.e., unintended but unavoidable by-products of adding the transparent truth predicate to our language. Four main theses are accordingly advanced in the book: (a) truth is transparent, (b) negation is exhaustive, © there are true falsehoods, and (d) dialetheias are merely semantic. Of these, (a) is simply assumed, while the others are defended in the book. To show the coherency of these ideas, Beall also describes a formal “model” language BXTT of transparent truth which contains a “suitable conditional” and an intersubstitutability rule for truth, and sketches a proof that BXTT has a natural and non-trivial model. The emphasis of the book, however, is on philosophy rather than logic (most of the logical results mentioned in the book can be found in previous works of G. Priest, R. Brady, S. Kripke and H. Field). Indeed, as a philosophical work, it does a great job in presenting and defending its ideas. Though logicians will find little new in this book, it may still serve as an excellent and readable introduction to the contemporary technical discussions about truth and semantic paradoxes. In what follows, I will first give a brief summary of Beall’s view, and then point out several of his claims and arguments that do not look very plausible to me.

1. Beall’s main theses

Truth is transparent according to Beall. The transparent conception of truth (ttruth henceforth) is the conception according to which “is true” is a constructed, entirely see-through device introduced via the rule of intersubstitutability: that “x is true” and “x” are intersubstitutable in all (non-opaque) contexts for all sentences “x” of our language. Thus, “is true” is not introduced into our language to name any feature of the world, but to enable generalizations that we couldn’t otherwise express. With Field, Beall embraces disquotationalism as a methodological stance, and he assumes methodological disquotationalism throughout the book without any discussion. Though I disagree with Beall at this point, I will make the same assumption in this review anyway.

To Beall, to accept that negation is exhaustive just is to accept the law of excluded middle (LEM, which is equivalent to the doctrine of bivalence when truth is viewed as ttruth). Beall accepts that negation is essentially exhaustive; he thinks that negation by its very nature exhaustively carves up our claims into the ttrue and the tfalse, or the ttrue and not the ttrue. However, Beall refrains from endorsing any argument for LEM, though he thinks that the intuition behind it is fairly strong. Beall also recognizes that there are serious worries regarding the exhaustive conception of negation, the most serious of which being the phenomenon of unsettledness related to vague predicates. To alleviate such a worry, Beall proposes a non-epistemic, classical account of vagueness and unsettledness in Section 5.2 of his book, but I am afraid that his account may not be as plausible as he thinks (see below).

Beall holds that paradoxical sentences are just spandrels. Originally, the word “spandrels” refers to things created as a side effect of another design, for instance the wall space between two adjacent arches. Beall claims that language has its own spandrels: introducing “is true” into the grammatical environment of English yields spandrels, namely, truth-ineliminable sentences, sentences from which “is true” cannot be eliminated via the governing intersubstitutability rule, such as the liar sentences and Curry’s sentences. Once spandrels enter our language, we must decide how our logic should deal with them and what their ttruth-theoretical status should be. There aren’t many options here: given that one accepts the validity of reasoning by case and the transparency conception of truth, one must either reject some instances of LEM or accept some contradictions (or both). Beall chooses the latter; he takes a dialetheic position according to which there are some ttrue tfalsehoods or gluts. In fact, Beall treats all spandrels except Curry’s sentences as gluts. Given that there are gluts in our language, and given that trivialism is not a rational option, the broad logic of our language has to be paraconsistent.

While his position is dialetheic, Beall thinks that his dialetheism is fairly mundane, at least compared with Priest’s position. Beall calls his dialetheist view “deflated dialetheism”, according to which gluts are “merely semantic” in the sense that the base language or the ttruth-free language is completely glut-free. One benefit of this merely semantic approach is that the classical logic rules are automatically true for the base language, while the other benefit is its light ontological load. I am inclined to think that Beall’s arguments for the advantages of his theory over and above Priest’s are completely convincing, but one must be careful to separate this plausible thesis from other related things that Beall says in the book (see section 2 below).

So Beall endorses a theory of ttruth in which (i) “x is true” and “x” are intersubstitutable and, derivatively, T-schema is a valid form; (ii) LEM holds without exception; (iii) some ttruth-involving sentences are both ttrue and tfalse while no ttruth-free sentences are glut; and (iv) the Explosion Rule or EFQ (infer everything from contradiction) is not a valid rule. But he also wants (v) the conditional involved in the formulation of T-schema to be a “suitable” one, where a suitable conditional is one that validates Modus Ponens and Identity ("A A" is valid for every sentence A) but invalidates all Curry-generating Contraction rules (such as: from "A (A B)", infer "A B"). In order to prove that the combination of (i)-(v) is coherent, Beall describes a formal theory BXTT in the first two chapters and sketches a proof that BXTT has non-trivial and natural models, i.e., non-trivial models in which the base language has no gluts. The proof, though not original, is very reader-friendly and the result is beyond any doubt. In the rest of the book except Chapter 4, Beall sets out to reply to various possible objections against his deflated dialetheism. Chapter 4 is a brief introduction to Kripke’s fixed point theory and Field’s recent paracomplete account of ttruth and paradoxes. Though brief and informal, the introduction is very useful for people without technical background.

It must be admitted that Beall’s deflated dialetheism is logically simpler and ontologically more defensible than Priest’s often cited approach, and it should therefore very much be welcomed by the dialetheic camp. I have, however, some reservations about it.

2. Spandrels and the symmetry policy

Beall thinks that (i) the introduction of the ttruth predicate into our language yields spandrels, i.e., ttruth-ineliminable sentences, sentences from which “is true” cannot be eliminated via the intersubstitutability rules; (ii) ttruths of spandrels do not supervene on the base-language ttruths; and (iii) though asymmetric treatment of spandrels is an open option, all spandrels can nevertheless be treated as gluts. None of these claims seems to me to be exactly right, and they should all be distinguished from the more plausible thesis that our base language is glut-free. To begin with, (i) is certainly not right unless by “sentences” Beall means sentence tokens, for one and the same sentence type may have both ttruth-eliminable tokens and ttruth-ineliminable ones. Even if we understand these claims as claims about sentence tokens, (ii) and (iii) are still not quite right. To see why this is so, consider one of Kripke’s examples. Suppose Dean on one occasion asserts

(1) Some of Nixon’s utterances about Watergate are false,

intending the quantifier to range over (2), while Nixon in turn asserts

(2) Everything Dean says about Watergate is false,

intending his quantifier to range over (1). In this case, both (1) and (2) are ttruth-ineliminable sentence tokens, but their ttruth or tfalsity may still depend upon some base-language ttruths. Suppose Dean has uttered at least one base-language ttruth about Watergate other than (1). Then, in virtue of that base-language ttruth, we can conclude that Nixon’s (2) is tfalse and Dean’s (1) is ttrue, though both are ttruth-ineliminable. Examples like this show not only that at least the ttruths of some spandrels supervene on the base-language ttruths, but also that an asymmetric treatment of spandrels is somehow forced upon us, not simply an open possibility. In fact, Beall himself is forced to violate his own symmetry policy and regard all Curry’s sentences as simply false while treating all other spandrels as gluts. The above example merely shows that such an asymmetric treatment is already in force when we consider more mundane cases.

3. Suitable conditionals and the utility of valid arguments

Beall wants his language of ttruth to contain a suitable conditional; consequently he can no longer take valid arguments to be “ttruth-preserving” in the sense that (V) holds universally:

(V) Valid(〈α〉, 〈β〉) (Tr(〈α〉) Tr(〈β〉)).

Here, (V) is a principle about valid arguments restricted to those with a single premise, and "" is Beall’s suitable conditional. If (V) is true universally, then, by transparency of ttruth, (V) gives rise to

(V1) Valid(〈α〉, 〈β〉) (α β).

Given that detaches, plus plausible assumptions about conjunction, we will have

(2.1) Valid(〈α (α β), 〈β〉).

But then, by (V1), (2.1), and Modus Ponens, we immediately get a form of contraction for , namely (2.2), violating the assumption that "" is Beall’s suitable conditional:

(2.2) (α (α β)) β.

So Beall must reject (V) and he does. He accepts, however, a principle similar to (V):

(V’) Valid(〈α〉, 〈β〉) (Tr(〈α〉) Tr(〈β〉)).

Yet "" does not detach in BXTT; consequently there is a worry about the utility of a “valid” argument satisfying (V’): one can know that an argument is “valid” and that its premises are all true, but cannot conclude via (V’) that its conclusion is also true. What then is a valid argument good for? Beall’s reply to this question is that the utility of a valid argument consists in its necessarily providing a proper step, where a proper step is understood as a reasoning step that goes either from ttruth to ttruth, or from unttruth (tfalsity) to ttruth, or from unttruth to unttruth.

One may wonder whether this is a plausible, dialetheic account of the utility of a valid argument. After all, a valid argument may also go from ttruth to tfalsity for a dialetheist, a simple example being an argument that has one and the same liar sentence as its sole premise and conclusion. Beall, however, does not think that this is a serious problem: he thinks that all such valid arguments remain useful in the defined sense: they still necessarily provide proper reasoning steps, i.e., steps from ttruth to ttruth, unttruth to ttruth, or unttruth to unttruth. I think that Beall’s reply here is very implausible, for not only are there valid arguments that may go from ttruth to tfalisty, there are also useful but invalid arguments according to Beall’s account. For example, since the so-called “Explosion Rule” or EFQ is not a valid form of BXTT, some arguments having a sentence and its negation as premises are counted invalid in BXTT. Yet all such invalid arguments are “useful” in the above sense, for they still necessarily provide steps from unttruth to truth-values of their conclusions, whatever that be. Similarly, an argument that has a liar sentence as its sole premise may not be valid in BXTT either, yet it remains “useful” in that it always provides a proper step of reasoning, a step from the unttruth of the liar to the truth-value of the conclusion, whatever it is. So, all valid arguments and many invalid arguments are equally “useful” in that they all necessarily provide proper reasoning steps. What then distinguishes valid arguments from invalid ones? Beall is silent on this question, and I suppose that a reply appealing to Beall’s formal semantics is question-begging. Of course, Beall may reply that being “useful” in the defined sense is only a necessary condition for being valid, and there are other necessary conditions that a valid argument must satisfy. What are these other necessary conditions? Again, Beall says nothing about this further question.

Rejecting (V), Beall sketches three optional accounts of validity. None of them, I think, is helpful in replying to the previous question. Beall’s first account takes the notion of validity to be primitive, which certainly does not offer a reply to the question of what distinguishes valid and useful arguments from invalid but useful ones. His second account defines validity in terms of the notion of a valid form, which in turn is defined in terms of true-in-M. Under this account, invalid but useful arguments certainly have no valid logical form, but this is so only because Beall has decided not to count them as having a valid logical form. This decision is not a reply to our previous question either. Finally, his third account takes the notion of validity to have at most a partial definition, i.e., have only sufficient conditions. What are these sufficient conditions? Beall actually gives only one of them, namely:

(S) (α β) Valid(〈α〉, 〈β〉).

(S)‘s antecedent is supposed to be satisfied by many arguments having "α" as their sole premise and "β" as their conclusion. Yet some argument with "α (α β)" as the sole premise and "β" as the conclusion, though valid, does not satisfy the antecedent of (S), which means that its validity is due to their satisfying some sufficient condition C other than (S). Moreover, neither this condition C nor any other sufficient condition is supposed to be satisfied by any invalid but useful argument. What are these conditions other than (S) anyway? It seems to me that we are still in the dark about them.

4. LEM and unsettledness

Beall takes Field’s paracomplete theory to be the main competitor of his account. Indeed, given that one accepts the validity of reasoning by case and the transparency of ttruth, the options for dealing with the paradoxes are quite limited: one must either reject some instances of LEM or accept some contradictions. Paraconsistent dialetheists like Beall take the second option, while paracomplete theorists like Field take the first. One of Field’s reasons for adopting the paracomplete approach is that it provides a unified account of semantic paradoxes and paradoxes involving vagueness: both sorts of paradoxes are regarded by Field to be instances of the same phenomenon of unsettledness or indeterminacy, the phenomenon that some sentences are neither determinately true nor determinately false. (There may well be other instances of the phenomenon, such as evaluative (ethical and aesthetical) sentences and defective sentences involving non-denoting phrases, but I will leave them aside.) The phenomenon of unsettledness is usually thought to require the failure of LEM, so there will be no reason to insist that negation is exhaustive and that the correct logic is paraconsistent if Field is right in thinking that vagueness is a genuine instance of unsettledness.

Beall, however, insists that no sentence of our language is indeterminate or unsettled, so that LEM holds without exception. How then will Beall account for the apparent unsettledness if every predicate has a clear cutoff of application? Beall thinks that the appearance is neither essentially epistemic nor one that involves the failure of LEM; the real unsettledness arises at the “atomic” level instead. In fact, Beall suggests that, for every “positive atomic” predicate "φ" of our language, there is an atomic contrary or “overline-mate” of it, "non-φ", such that, though nothing can be both φ and non-φ, something can be neither φ nor non-φ. Beall’s proposal then is that, while our language is bivalent, there is also unsettledness in a non-epistemic sense: there are “gaps” in the sense that for some b and some vague atomic predicate "φ" we have

¬φ(b) ¬non-φ(b).

There are many good questions that can be raised against Beall’s account of vagueness. For example, what is a positive predicate? And what is an atomic predicate? Is the overline-mate (or one of the overline-mates) of an overline-mate of φ itself? Why should we take the (or any) overline-mate of an atomic positive predicate to be atomic too? Presumably an atomic predicate is just a primitive or an undefined predicate, in contrast with a defined one, but why should one restrict the phenomenon of apparent unsettledness to primitive predicates? If a primitive predicate is “vague”, should not many other predicates defined in terms of it be vague too? Perhaps it is too much to assume that for every defined as well as every undefined predicate of our language there is a contrary or overline-mate of it, but if this is indeed too much to assume, so much the worse for Beall’s account.

Putting these questions aside, I think there are two more worries about Beall’s account of vagueness. First, many vague predicates, such as “tall”, “smart”, and etc., are also “degree predicates”, so that "is more φ than A" or "is less φ than A" are natural ways to attribute “vague properties” to things. Furthermore, this feature of “tall” and “smart” presumably is also true of at least some atomic vague predicates, whatever these are. However, if vague predicates are actually clear-cut, it will be difficult to imagine how one is supposed to explain the phenomenon that, in some cases, a thing’s having a vague property is also its having the property to a certain degree. Second, when "φ" is a vague predicate, not only will there be an object whose being φ or not is indeterminate, typically there will also be an object whose being indeterminate with respect to φ or not is also indeterminate, and, further on, also an object whose being indeterminate with respect to the indeterminacy of being φ or not is also indeterminate too, and so on. That is, not only will we have an object b such that

¬φ(b) ¬non-φ(b),

we typically will also have an object c such that

¬φ© ¬(¬φ© ¬non-φ©) ¬non-φ©,

and may also have an object d such that

¬φ(d) ¬(¬φ(d) ¬(¬φ(d) ¬non-φ(d)) ¬non-φ(d)) ¬non-φ(d),

and so on. In short, the phenomenon of vagueness seems to be through and through. But this is impossible if negation is exhaustive. Of course, Beall can explain the thoroughness of a vague predicate by saying that, when φ is a vague predicate, not only will we have an object b such that

¬φ(b) ¬non-φ(b),

we typically will also have an object c such that

¬φ© ¬non-(¬φ© ¬non-φ©) ¬non-φ©,

and may also have an object d such that

¬φ(d) ¬non(¬φ(d) ¬(¬φ(d) ¬non-φ(d)) ¬non-φ(d)) ¬non-φ(d),

and so on. But this way of explaining the thoroughness of vagueness depends on whether and how it can be justified that for every defined or undefined predicate of our language there is a contrary or overline-mate of it. Again, such an account is missing in Beall’s book.

5. Gluts and gaps

One of the objections to Beall’s theory is that, though he claims himself to be a dialetheist, he is actually a gap theorist. For, where "α" is a liar-like spandrel, not only will Beall be committed to "Tr(〈α〉) ¬Tr(〈α〉)", he will also be committed to, via intersubstitutability rules, "¬Tr(〈α〉) ¬Tr(〈¬α〉)". Yet the latter seems exactly to be the claim that a gap theorist would make: "α" is neither true nor false! When replying to this objection, Beall agrees (with Field) that no dialetheist who accepts the intersubstitutability rules can accept the claim that a sentence is glutty without also accepting that that very sentence is also gappy, and conversely. So, while the objector is correct, his objection is not harmful. To Beall, spandrels are just such peculiar things: they are both ttrue and tfalse, and both not ttrue and not tfalse.

While I agree with Beall (and Field) that a dialetheic theorist of transparent ttruth has no choice but to say that all gluts are also gaps and vice versa, I don’t think that this result is a congenial one for such a theory. For one thing, it leaves a gap theorist no way to oppose a dialetheist about the ttruth-theoretical status of spandrels, and vice versa. Yet aren’t they supposed to oppose each other at least on the truth-theoretical status of liar sentences? It would be therefore less confusing if we had a dialetheic theory of truth, such as the one proposed by Priest, that does not equate gluts with gaps. Beall may retort that even on Priest’s account, one must accept of liar sentences that they are gluts and that they are not gluts: since each glut is not true, hence not both truth and false, so a glut is also not a glut even on Priest’s account. Isn’t this result as unpalatable as the one I just mentioned about Beall’s account? I don’t think so. One of the aims that a dialetheic theory is designed for is to allow us to assert that something is both an F and not an F, so it is harmless that a dialetheic theory turns out to have this feature. On the other hand, a dialetheic theory is not designed to blur the distinction between itself and a gap theory, but to distinguish itself from the latter. On that account, Beall’s theory leaves other dialetheic theories at an advantage.