Spectacles of Truth in Classical Greek Philosophy: Theoria in its Cultural Context

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Andrea Wilson Nightingale, Spectacles of Truth in Classical Greek Philosophy: Theoria in its Cultural Context, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 311pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521838258.

Reviewed by Alan Kim, University of Memphis


Spectacles of Truth in Classical Greek Philosophy (SOT) is the latest and hopefully not the last installment of Andrea Wilson Nightingale's (AN) project of situating ancient Greek philosophy in its cultural context. In her book, Genres in Dialogue: Plato and the Construct of Philosophy (Cambridge University Press, 1995), AN presented Plato's dialogues as part of his struggle to define philosophy as a cultural practice distinct from rhetoric and sophistic. In SOT, she turns her attention to the various ways in which the religious pilgrimage called "theôria" was appropriated by fourth-century (BCE) philosophers in crafting both the private and public image. AN expressly states that her book is not an "analytic" investigation of epistemology; yet it is just this refusal in principle to address the nature of philosophical knowledge and its objects -- i.e., the subjects of metaphoric representation -- that constitutes the major weakness of her book. But aside from this issue, discussed below, her book should greatly help modern readers, and especially philosophers, appreciate the many layers of suggestion encoded in a common word like "theory," to which we would otherwise not be alive.

In the first chapter, "Theoria as a cultural practice," AN gives a rich and detailed account of the religious and political dimensions of theôria and their various links. Theôria signifies the ritual journey from one's city to an oracular center or religious festival (40); the participation in various rites, culminating in the viewing of sacred images or objects; and the return to one's city. The "theoric" pilgrim could make his journey either as a city's delegate to a festival, or as a private individual; AN focuses on the latter. Beyond their strictly religious function, the theôriai served as a neutral site where differences between Greek cities could be negotiated in a pan-hellenic context. AN makes much of the symbolic and psychological stages of the pilgrims' journey, especially the "liminal" experience of crossing from the secular familiarity of his native town, through the space between town and temple, to the sacred dislocation of the religious site itself. The pilgrim undergoes various transformations -- perhaps religious, perhaps political or cultural -- as a result of the freedom of the journey itself, as well as his exposure to the sacred mystery-objects and theôroi from other parts of the Greek world. His return to his city therefore represented a moment of risk as much as benefit: along with the required report of the festival could come the contagion of alien notions. AN admits this chapter could stand independently "as a contribution to Greek 'cultural studies' (and therefore offers a more detailed analysis than the study of philosophic theôria perhaps requires)" (41), and one wonders how the fine distinctions made between theôros and theatês, or the detailed description of Alcibiades's opulence at the Olympian games will aid us in understanding spectacles of philosophical truth.

In Chapter Two, AN contrasts Plato's use of the tropes of civic theôria in the Republic with those of private theôria in the Symposium and the Phaedrus. The Republic begins and ends with theôriai: as the dialogue opens, Socrates is returning from his trip to Piraeus to "theorize" an international festival in honor of the Thracian goddess, Bendis; it closes with the myth of Er's "descent" to Hades. AN nicely brings out Plato's use of theoric imagery in these "frames" of the dialogue. The Allegory of the Cave,[1] too, may be read in terms of a civic religious pilgrimage, since the purpose of the journey out of the cave is to see the forms, and then return to the city bearing the beneficial fruits of one's sojourn beyond the gates. On the other hand, the theoric allusions in the Symposium are to the Eleusinian Mysteries, which, though public and international, "focused on the private individual, offer him or her salvation in the afterlife" (85). The charioteer-myth in the Phaedrus takes the imagery of an individual's initiation into sacred seeing even further. As AN argues in more detail in Chapter Four, Plato in the Phaedrus conceives of beautiful bodies as prompting the embodied soul to recollect its vision of the eidetic "mysteries." Plato's use of this private, salvific type of theôria raises the question of the philosophical theôros's relation to the other members of his socio-political community. His transformation, as AN frequently reminds the reader, makes him a "stranger" to his city; yet, as she also argues throughout SOT, Plato's (as opposed to Aristotle's) theôros openly acts in accordance with his mystic knowledge. He does not conceal it, but "attempts to communicate it by way of rational argumentation that is open to inspection" (92). She concludes that Plato's use of the "discourse and structure of traditional theôria" in these dialogues represents his attempt to legitimize "theoretical philosophy" (92-93); yet how or why Plato thought this discourse and structure would in fact legitimize philosophy in the eyes of the public is left unexplored.

Chapter Three consists in a detailed reading of the motifs of theôria in the cave allegory. This long chapter includes many fascinating and original observations on perhaps the best-known of Plato's literary images. For example, AN's discussion of Plato's contrast between true, philosophical freedom and the utilitarian philistinism of the "banausic" person (118-127) deftly analyzes Plato's rhetorical strategy and the paradox of "philosophic rulers [who] are … foreigners in their own city -- outsiders who serve the city free of charge" (126). Again, her critique of Julia Annas's and T.H. Irwin's interpretations of the philosopher's "reentry" into the cave are convincing and important (134-135). AN argues that Plato does not "oppose the contemplative to the practical life; rather he differentiates between the philosophical and the political life" (133): the philosopher is perfectly willing, and indeed supremely able to act, but unless he finds himself in a true city, he acts privately rather than politically (133-134).

Nevertheless, it is in this chapter that AN's deliberate exclusion of "epistemological" problems manifests a basic weakness with the book as a whole. As I suggested above, by restricting herself to the metaphoric basis of philosophic theôria in the "sacralized" vision of mysterious spectacles, she never addresses the question of what this metaphoric theôria is a metaphor for. Precisely by calling attention to the metaphorics of philosophy figured as "theory," AN raises the urgent question of whether and how the experience Plato is calling "theory" in fact differs from mystic vision. For example, AN calls attention to the contrast between the soul's active battle for knowledge on the upward path, on the one hand, and, on the other hand, its passive receptivity of the forms' splendor at the end of its arduous journey (114). Since dialectic is clearly an activity, she concludes that Plato distinguishes a passive knowing of forms from an active, dialectical pursuit of that knowing (110). This strikes me as either taking the metaphor of vision too far, or not thinking through what "vision" means enough. Why should seeing be understood as purely passive? Why could seeing -- or "seeing" forms, at any rate -- not involve a dialectical component? This may well be a point where the metaphor of vision fails adequately to represent the activity of contemplation (as AN herself calls it [95]). In a strange way, AN's abstention from "examin[ing] Plato's epistemology in analytic terms" (97) mirrors her interpretation of philosophical theôria itself: she seems to think that a simple presentation of the metaphor can speak for itself, just as the forms can give themselves self-evidently to the properly purified soul.

As she puts it herself, on the one hand, the visual metaphor "emphasizes the nature of the Forms as ontological presences: the Forms are metaphysical beings that are substantial, have independent standing, and possess determinate boundaries which distinguish them from one another" (110). On the other hand, the metaphor "presents us with a particular model of apprehension," to wit:

In the act [what kind of act? Cf. 114] of theoretical contemplation, the philosopher views a reality or being that he cannot touch, change, or in any way affect. We construct language and arguments but reality is something that we see.[2] (110-111)

If reality is something that we passively (114,116) apprehend or "receive"[3] through vision as "given," then perhaps AN is right that this is what Plato intends by his visual metaphors. But it is naïve to assume, as she does, that "we construct language and arguments but reality is something we see." On the contrary, what we see as real is closely connected -- if not determined -- by those same linguistic and argumentative "constructs," and this is precisely what dialectic is meant to do: to make us see things differently. It is through dialectic (in its elenctic mode) that the prisoners are made to see the shadows as shadows, and it is through dialectic (in its constructive mode) that they are progressively dragged from the cave (a strange kind of "journey"). If it is through dialectic that we come to see new things both in and outside the cave, then a special argument is required why the "vision" of the forms is essentially "non-discursive," and what that can mean.[4] Thus, when AN writes:

As in traditional theôria at religious festivals, Platonic theôria features a sacralized mode of spectating that differs from mundane modes of viewing. What is the nature of this new kind of "theoric" gaze? What does the philosopher see? And what does he fail to see? (97)

I would add the following questions: To what extent is this "theoric" gaze a gaze at all? In what sense does the philosopher see, or fail to see?[5] This review is of course not the place to venture an answer of my own to these questions; I raise them merely as questions which SOT should be asked, if we are to understand not only why Plato fixed upon the trope of theôria, but also what the limits of this trope may be.

A related problem in this chapter concerns AN's discussion of the perspectival nature of the philosopher's "vision" of the forms. She writes:

The philosopher must accept the condition of blindness as the precondition for philosophic insight. He goes blind in order that he may see. The activity of metaphysical contemplation does not, then, offer a "god[']s-eye view," i.e. the simultaneous and panoptic vision of all things, both human and divine. Rather, the philosophic theôros blinds himself to the human realm in order to see a vision that transforms his soul and gives him a radically different perspective on the world when he returns to it. (104-105)

This passage distorts what is going on in the cave allegory, insofar as it seems to place "philosophic insight" on the same level as the doxastic sight of the prisoners. It is true of course that once the prisoner first freed has turned from the shadows towards the statuettes carried behind the wall, he sees the statuettes and not the shadows, and likewise, when he is outside the cave he sees the things above, and can no longer see the things below. But this is not what Plato means by blindness: the eye is blinded momentarily at each transition from less real to more real object of contemplation. After a period of adjustment, the eye is not only not blind, but sees better, because the light of truth is more intense. Thus the philosopher contemplating the forms in no way "must accept the condition of blindness as the precondition for philosophic insight": he is seeing as well as one could hope. Rather, he is simply not looking anymore at the things in the cave. To the extent that he is now ignoring the unrealities in the cave, it is true that his vision is not panoptic, but it is far from clear that Plato means wisdom to involve such a universal scope: the wise person knows all the forms. The participant particulars are not even possible objects of such knowledge. This difficulty in AN's interpretation is apparently linked to her reading of D.M. Levin's critique of "ocularcentrism" in Western metaphysics. From Levin, who "follows Heidegger in his criticism of ancient conceptions of truth and knowledge," AN takes the notion of a "frontal" view of the forms -- something she denies Plato's human philosopher ever achieves. It is not clear why she denies this, if the forms are in fact objects of a faculty of mysterious intuition: if they are not physical things, and if they give themselves to the viewer, in what sense could they still have a "side" that could remain hidden?

Chapter Four, on "theorizing the beautiful body: from Plato to Philip of Opus," contains an important discussion on an apparent exception to Plato's denigration of the bodily senses: the beautiful body, human or astral, serves an iconic function,[6] somehow channeling the beauty of the forms (or of the form of Beauty) through the physical eye to the soul. This chapter would seem to contain the most convincing links, in the Phaedo, Phaedrus, and Timaeus, between the traditional practice of theôria and Platonic philosophy. Here Plato seems to appropriate much more directly than in the cave allegory the theôroi's gaze upon the sacred physical images or statues at the climax of the theôria as themselves constituting a sort of contact with divinity itself. Yet even here, AN does not take as critical a stance towards the meaning of the visual metaphorics as she might. For example, she seems to accept the following passage more or less at face value: "When the charioteer looks upon [the boy], his memory is carried back to the true nature of beauty, and he sees it again standing together with Temperance upon a holy pedestal" (Phaedrus, 254b) (163). The hyperbolic phrase -- "he sees it again standing together with Temperance upon a holy pedestal" -- should make one think twice about how literally we are to understand this vision, and hence how literally we are to take the metaphor of vision itself.

Chapter Five, finally, explores Aristotle's reduction of Plato's multi-dimensional and "erotic" conception of philosophic theorizing to the moment of pure, disinterested, and useless noetic activity. AN here again makes the useful point that compared to Aristotle, Plato's theôria appears implicitly connected with praxis (albeit not necessarily political action). Moreover, her detailed discussion of how nous actually works on its own terms, and what a theorizing grasp of first principles means non-metaphorically (235-240), makes this chapter more solid methodologically -- if less glittering -- than her discussions of Plato.

I have focused my attention so far on just those epistemological issues from which AN wants to exempt herself; I have done so because I believe such an exemption must distort the project of understanding the metaphor of vision precisely as a metaphor, because it creates a temptation to take the metaphor too literally. AN's comparative project, however, raises fascinating parallels between what she (following Edie and Victor Turner) calls the "liminal" stage of the pilgrimage (42) and the double sense of alienation felt by the journeying pilgrim and his home community towards each other. More, perhaps, could have been made, in this connection, of Plato's elaborate imagery of the xenos (stranger; guest-friend), xenia (guest-friendship), and the intermediary function of the daimonic philosopher, shuttling between god and human.

Finally, there are a number of technical problems in the presentation that an editor should have caught. No clear policy seems to be followed in rendering Greek terms. Sometimes these are transliterated, sometimes they are left in Greek; when transliterated, no consistent policy is followed for marking long vowels; for example, "theôria" and its cognates are written "theoria" throughout. A large number of German and French titles in the bibliography contain misspellings.

[1] AN throughout calls the cave allegory the "Analogy of the Cave." I question this departure from the traditional locution below.

[2] In fact, this passage seems directly to contradict AN's own account of Plato's theory of vision (10-11).

[3] Cf. 158-159.

[4] To be fair, AN notes that the metaphor of "seeing Being" is not enough to "demonstrate that contemplation is a non-discursive mode of thought" (110, n. 24). But she does not seem sensitive enough to the consequences of not addressing this point directly herself.

[5] AN's perhaps inadvertent literalism regarding "visions" of the forms seems encoded in her phrase, "Analogy of the Cave," rather than "Allegory of the Cave." Thinking of the cave mythos as an analogy will perhaps tempt one to find precise parallels where merely an allegorical representation of fundamental differences is intended.

[6] Cf. 164.