Speech and Harm: Controversies over Free Speech

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Ishani Maitra and Mary Kate McGowan (eds.), Speech and Harm: Controversies over Free Speech, Oxford University Press, 2012, 255pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199236275.

Reviewed by Frederick Schauer, University of Virginia


Philosophical work on the right to freedom of speech (or, as it is more commonly characterized outside of the United States, freedom of expression) has until relatively recently been largely celebratory. Or at least justificatory. Philosophers have started with the premise that there just is a right to free speech and have devoted their efforts to exploring its foundations and examining its implications. Even apart from John Stuart Mill's On Liberty, which remains the touchstone for much work in this justificatory vein, we see important work identifying the roots of a distinct right to freedom of speech in listener autonomy (Scanlon 1972), speaker autonomy (Nagel 1995), speaker dignity and respect (Dworkin 1977, pp. 201-205), democratic theory (Meiklejohn 1948), personal identity (Raz 1991), freedom of thought (Shiffrin 2010), and straight utility-maximization (Sumner 2004), among many others. And although this scholarship has been important and illuminating, it would be a stretch to describe very much of it as deeply skeptical. And the terrain in legal scholarship has been even flatter, with the topic of free speech dominated by Americans seeking to justify the uniquely strong protection of freedom of speech and press in the United States, and with dissenting voices few and far between.

The terrain started to shift a few decades ago, largely as a consequence of two different phenomena. One was the emergent attention to various forms of racist speech, typically protected in the United States and rarely protected elsewhere. The American approach could be and frequently was defended with standard slippery-slope and related arguments, but the difficulty of saying that such speech was harmless, coupled with the exceptionalism of the American approach (Schauer 2005), made it far easier for philosophers and others to argue that principles of equality and dignity justified restrictions. And at roughly the same time as free-speech skepticism in the context of so-called hate speech became more visible, the feminist anti-pornography movement called insistent attention to the harms of the kind of speech that traditional liberals had characterized as harmless, and at the same time made it harder to deny the claims of gender equality that lay behind the call for refusing to tolerate images, especially, whose production and dissemination embodied and fostered an environment in which sex discrimination flourished and the problem of sexual violence was downplayed.

The feminist anti-pornography movement not only generated a focus on the harms of images endorsing sexual violence (most of which are not sexually explicit, and thus not pornographic according to conventional definitions), but also fostered a distinct strand of explicitly analytic philosophical work supporting such arguments. Catharine MacKinnon, most prominently, had influentially argued that pornography not only caused but also constituted sex discrimination (MacKinnon 1987, 1993). A common response to such claims was that they needed to be understood metaphorically, as part of a public campaign for legal and social change, but not as an argument that could stand up to serious philosophical scrutiny. And in response to these responses, a group of philosophers, drawing heavily but not exclusively on speech act theory, sought to demonstrate that beneath the rhetoric of MacKinnon and others was a serious and novel philosophical claim -- that the speaking capacity of speakers can be curtailed by the speech of others. If those who dominate a linguistic community can with their words and their usages produce a change in the conventions of language such that "zebra" no longer refers to zebras but instead to crocodiles, it becomes impossible, or at least more difficult, to refer to zebras. Think, for example, of how difficult it has become in recent years to use the phrase "begging the question" in its traditionally proper sense, now that the words of others have made the phrase synonymous with "inviting the question." Similarly, therefore, the dominant forces in a linguistic community can with their words make it difficult or impossible for women to say "no" when they mean "no," or in other ways express their thoughts, feelings, and ideas. This is, to oversimplify, the essence of the argument first made by Melinda Vadas (Vadas 1987), developed more deeply and influentially by Rae Langton (Langton 1993), and then made increasingly more complex and sophisticated by additional work by Langton, as well as in influential books and articles by Susan Dwyer (Dwyer, 1993), Jennifer Hornsby (Hornsby, 1995), and a significant number of others.

The arguments of Langton and others can be understood in both politically strategic and in philosophically important ways. As political strategy, couching the harms of certain forms of speech in terms of "silencing" (MacKinnon's word) has the strategic advantage of refusing to concede the free speech position to the opponents of restriction. If speech is to be restricted or sanctioned because of its effect on the speech of others, then limiting speech is on both sides of the equation, and the question can no longer be thought of in terms of free speech versus something else, but rather as the speech of one versus the speech of another. In some contexts this shifting of the grounds of argument may not be important, but as long as arguments from free speech have a substantial degree of positive cultural resonance, then refusing to concede the free speech ground to one's opponents is good political strategy.

But the arguments are more than simply strategic. The philosophically important point is that language is a conventional practice, and thus the ways in which we can use and not use language are conventionally determined. Moreover, the conventions themselves are made and remade by the use of language, and thus speaking itself establishes the conventions by which members of a linguistic community can speak and establishes the conventions that determine what can be said and what cannot.

Speech and Harm is best and most valuably understood as an important collection of new articles within this last and philosophically most important tradition. The book is a bit of a grab bag. Andrew Altman defends the American approach to Holocaust Denial in particular and hate speech in general against the calls for restriction, and Laura Beth Nielsen offers an ethnographic account of the circumstances in which people do and do not "talk back," with the important, even if not surprising, conclusion that patterns of cultural dominance strongly influence who talks back and who does not. Both are useful contributions but seem a bit out of place in a book where other contributors -- Ishani Maitra, Rae Langton, Katharine Gelber, Mary Kate McGowan, Lynne Tirrell, and Caroline West, along with a substantive "Foreword" by MacKinnon -- are all focused on the philosophical dimensions of the speech act elaboration of the basic "silencing" claim. Indeed, philosophers will likely find less explicit philosophical content in Gelber's more political and legal doctrinal approach to the silencing issue and in MacKinnon's overview. In important ways, therefore, the philosophical heart of the book is in the chapters by Maitra, Langton, McGowan, Tirrell, and West, and these are the ones on which I will concentrate here.

Although Langton's prior work in the modern tradition just described has been focused on pornography, here she extends her arguments to other forms of hate speech -- racist speech, in particular -- and, of perhaps even greater philosophical interest, adds an interesting and important twist. Drawing explicitly on Robert Stalnaker's idea of linguistic "common ground" (Stalnaker 2002), and also, albeit less heavily, on David Lewis's "Scorekeeping in a Language Game" (Lewis 1983), Langton distinguishes the pragmatics of hate speech's consequences from the consequences caused by argumentative persuasion, by psychological conditioning, and by the phenomenon of imitation. Indeed, she even distinguishes her current view of the pragmatics of hate speech from the speech act account that she and others have offered elsewhere. Here she sees much of hate speech as involving often unspoken factual presuppositions, such as the presupposition that the described groups have such-and-such- undesirable characteristics. Hearers who wish to find common ground with speakers, therefore, or who wish to participate in the same language game, will find themselves inclined to accept a hate speaker's factual presuppositions, and in this way will be drawn, by virtue of the desire to speak a common language, into accepting factual claims that they might previously have resisted.

In developing her argument, Langton is aware of its empirical dimensions, but is worried about "ced[ing] this territory to the psychologist" (85). Yet perhaps she should not be so concerned. Here, as elsewhere, good rigorous philosophy, as with Langton's on this occasion, need not be thought of as mutually exclusive with cognitive psychology, social psychology, or other domains of empirical inquiry. And so we might well be interested in the circumstances under which someone wishes to find linguistic common ground with someone else, the circumstances under which finding that common ground would require accepting otherwise unaccepted or unknown factual presuppositions, and the circumstances under which people would or would not find, at some level of consciousness, that accepting the hitherto unacceptable is too high a price to pay. The idea of common ground is, as used by Langton, a valuable and new way of understanding how hate speech of all varieties might have effects on some people on some topics at some times, but there is no reason to believe that the question as insightfully formulated philosophically by Langton cannot then be pursued fruitfully in ways and with methods that are as much empirical as they are conceptual.

In advancing her argument about what she calls the "pragmatic model" of hate speech's consequences, Langton distinguishes the pragmatic model from the "speech act" model, and it is the speech act model that is developed in new directions here in McGowan's contribution. Her principal example is the "Whites Only" sign on a restaurant or hotel, and, drawing on J.L. Austin's idea of an exercitive -- an utterance that enacts a fact about what is permissible -- she argues persuasively that much of hate speech, and not just a "Whites Only" sign, is explicitly or implicitly an exercitive in just this sense. The speech does not just tell people what is permissible or not, and in that sense it is not strictly propositional. Rather, the speech act makes things impermissible, and thus constitutes rather than reports an act of discrimination.

For McGowan, the value in seeing certain acts of hate speech as constituting rather than causing or reporting discrimination lies in explaining why such acts should be understood as lying outside the coverage (and not just the protection, Schauer 2004) of the American First Amendment or any other principle of freedom of speech or freedom of expression. Just as the terms of a contract constitute rather than report or cause an agreement (the example is mine and not McGowan's), and just as prohibiting the "Whites Only" sign is not plausibly taken to be the kind of speech (in the ordinary language sense of that word) that even implicates the idea of free speech, so too should the speech that constitutes discrimination not be taken, McGowan argues, as justifying a plausible First Amendment objection.

As with Langton's argument, McGowan's philosophically astute claims often rely on empirical presuppositions that could be tested with empirical methods. In what is the most imaginative and important part of her contribution, McGowan identifies racism itself as a norm-governed activity and urges us to see that racist utterances can and often do change the norms of the norm-governed activity -- they are, as she says, covertly exercitive, because they are part of the practice of constituting the norms of the norm-governed activity. But McGowan is slightly too quick in moving from her valuable insight about the way in which racist speech can operate to create permissibility norms in the practice of racism to the extent to which they in fact do so. Her suppositions about this seem largely sound, but they are empirical nonetheless. Not every act in a norm-governed activity is norm-creating (or even norm-reinforcing), as opposed to norm-following, and we might want to start with McGowan's insights to design an empirical study in which we examined and tested the empirical claims that McGowan makes about the role that racist speech in general or particular acts of racist speech in particular play in constituting the norms of the practice of racism.

The chapter by Maitra is in much the same vein, albeit with a different philosophical focus. A widely-discussed question in the literature on speech acts and hate speech is the question of authority. Do the silencing, disempowering, and subordinating consequences of speech require an authoritative speaker, and does this authority come from rank, social position, and the like? Maitra addresses this question directly, arguing that "ordinary speakers" can have the kind of authority that can produce subordination. She offers a careful analysis of the different ways in which such consequences could ensue, but at the heart of many of them is the idea that speaking is a cooperative, coordinated, and conventional activity. If that is so, then speaking is, in McGowan's sense, both norm-creating and norm-governed. And if it is that, and if the norms of speaking and the norms that speech creates and reinforces emerge from below -- from the ground up rather than imposed from top down -- then every participant in the language game has a kind of authority and at least some pro rata role in producing the authoritative norms of the collective process. As with McGowan's argument, Maitra's could benefit from additional empirical support, exploring which ordinary speakers have which kind of authority or power in which kinds of circumstances, but she lays the groundwork for just such an empirical examination. Pace Langton's way of worrying about "ceding" the territory to the psychologists, it is perhaps better to see philosophical work as establishing testable hypotheses and clarifying the nature of the empirical work to be done. In this way, no discipline is ceding anything to the other, but rather they are working together in an effective way.

Indeed, perhaps the best way of understanding Tirrell's contribution is as providing some empirical support for kinds of claims made by McGowan and Maitra. Tirrell's careful analysis of the role that derogatory terms -- words -- played in the 1994 genocide in Rwanda fits well with McGowan's and Maitra's arguments, and Tirrell herself situates her case study within a theoretical framework that is a valuable complement to McGowan's. Thus, Tirrell says that "When speaker A uses a racial epithet to tell her friend B to stay away from a particular racial group of people, A sets up an insider/outsider relation, whereby A and B are not members of that group" (191). Here "sets up" is the crucial operative phrase, and the dynamic that Tirrell depicts and analyzes theoretically is not only compatible with McGowan's view about the permission-enacting force of speech, but is also admirably illustrated and empirically supported by the Rwanda example.

Of all of this volume's contributions in the general "speech act" vein, West's is the one most focused on freedom of speech as such. And she addresses directly the impetus for the silencing argument. If silencing does indeed occur, then the consequence will be less speech rather than more. And identifying the possibility that some speech might thereby produce less speech is not only about the strategy of the silencing argument and anti-pornography arguments from MacKinnon to the present. It is also about competing visions of freedom of speech itself. If free speech is largely or entirely about the negative right of a speaker to be free from external interference, especially by government, then a concern about how much speech there is becomes decidedly secondary. But if free speech is a positive value (putting aside whether it is a positive and enforceable right), then we are right to be concerned with how much speech there is and not just with the identification of sources of restriction. Mill very indirectly hints at this idea when he notes the value of the Catholic Church's institution of the Devil's Advocate, because in doing so he appears to recognize (but not do very much with) the possibility that if speech is valuable for epistemic (or other) purposes, then it is important to facilitate or create positive opportunities for speech and not just remove a certain set of negative impediments to it. In asking us to focus on the way in which some speech silences other speech, and in emphasizing that considerations of free speech itself might tell in favor of and not just against the regulation of hate speech, West opens up the vital inquiry into whether the very idea of free speech is just negative in the sense I have just explained, or whether it has positive dimensions that should lead us to be concerned about just how much speech there is, and about how wide a range of speech and speakers actually exist.

This book is subtitled "Controversies Over Free Speech," but in fact many of the existing controversies over free speech are depressingly conventional. Most of the settings for academic or "real world" free speech controversies are governmental restrictions of speakers, and most of the academic contributions still adopt the standard Millian paradigm for how we should understand the problem. Individuals are seen as the speakers, and governments are seen as the restrictors. The value of speech is then typically articulated in terms of some variety of individual self-expression, or in some way in which speech serves important epistemic or democracy-supporting functions. The speech-act turn in free speech theory is best understood, therefore, not merely as being about pornography, or about hate speech more generally, but as a new way of thinking about speech, its value, and its dangers. This new way need not supplant the more traditional understandings of the problem, but it is an important new direction, and one that is both consolidated and taken a step further in much that is contained in this important collection.


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